What Truth Is

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Mark Jago, What Truth Is, Oxford University Press, 2018, 356pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198823810.

Reviewed by David Liggins, University of Manchester


Truthmaker theorists have typically had little to say about the nature of truth, beyond suggesting that truthmaker theory might be seen as a form of correspondence theory. And theorists of the nature of truth have typically had little to say about truthmaker theory. Mark Jago's latest book brings together these debates and advances both of them. Jago argues that to be true is to have a truthmaker; that is, the property being true is numerically identical to the property having a truthmaker. He goes on to offer an account of the nature of propositions, and argues that this account, in combination with his account of the nature of truth, has the power to solve a range of paradoxes concerning truth, including the Liar.

So Jago sets himself several difficult tasks. He has to establish truthmaker theory in its strongest and most contentious form: the doctrine that for every truth, there is a truthmaker ('truthmaker maximalism'). Then he has to argue that being true is not just coextensive with having a truthmaker, but identical to it. And then there is the nature of propositions and the solutions to the paradoxes of truth. Of course, the book's ambition is among its strengths.

It is worth contrasting Jago's approach to truthmakers with the sort of view that is familiar from the work of C.B. Martin and David Armstrong. On that view, the principle that truths have truthmakers is 'fairly obvious once attention is drawn to it' (Armstrong 1989: 89). The principle can then be put to work, most notably in 'catching cheaters' (that is, in refuting theories such as phenomenalism) and in establishing the existence of states of affairs, which are required to serve as truthmakers for truths such as <the rose is red>. Jago concedes a great deal to critics of this position. He concedes that truthmaker theory is not obvious, and regards the existing attempts to justify it as unsuccessful (57-61). In particular, he rejects the idea that truthmaker theory implies any claims of mind-independence (6-8, 54-5). He also holds that truthmaker theory cannot be used to 'catch cheaters' (56-7) or establish the existence of states of affairs. Jago's argumentative strategy actually turns the Armstrong/Martin approach on its head. He provides independent arguments for an opulent ontology of states of affairs, including 'negative' ones, such as the state of affairs that there is no hippo in this room. Jago holds that the world contains enough states of affairs to supply at least one truthmaker for every truth. And so he argues from an ontology of states of affairs to truthmaker maximalism -- an elegant reversal of the traditional direction of argument. For Jago, the utility of truthmaker theory is not ontic but alethic: it enables us to solve the paradoxes of truth.

Jago does agree with Armstrong that all truths have truthmakers (10); in other words, they both reject non-maximalist versions of truthmaker theory. To defend maximalism, Jago (89-95) draws on his 2012 Mind paper, in which he argues that non-maximalists are committed to finding exceptionless necessary and sufficient conditions for propositional knowledge, that is, to solving the 'Gettier problem'. This argument is notable for connecting questions about truthmaking to questions about analysis. A particular strength of the book is that it contains (96-101) Jago's replies to critics of this paper, Matthew Simpson (2014) and Alexander Skiles (2014).

Before arguing for his own theory of truth, Jago spends some time attacking deflationism and pluralism about truth (24-38, 39-52). His attack on deflationism centres on the question of how deflationists are to state their theory. Jago argues that the deflationist cannot take her theory to consist of all the biconditional propositions of the form <<A> is true iff A>, because this would miss out the instances for which no English sentence expresses <A>. He concludes that the deflationist must invoke the function from propositions to propositions which maps <A> to <<A> is true iff A>; deflationism will then consist of the outputs of this function. But in order to invoke such a function, Jago argues, the deflationist must take propositions to be structured. On a Russellian approach, there will be a dubious circularity: the outputs will not only determine which property being true is, but will also have their identities partially fixed by that property, since it will be a constituent of the outputs. And on a Fregean approach, modes of presentation of being true will partially determine the identity of the outputs, which clashes with the principle that the identity of an object is independent of its modes of presentation. Jago concludes that on either approach, there is a serious problem for deflationists. He also provides related arguments that the deflationist cannot deny the existence of Liar propositions.

Jago considers only deflationists such as Paul Horwich, whose theory consists of infinitely many claims about specific propositions, rather than those who offer a generalization covering all propositions. He neglects the idea that the deflationists might state her theory using quantification into sentence position, where this is conceived not substitutionally, but as a conceptual primitive irreducible to first-order quantification. That strikes me as a significant omission. (This piece of apparatus was invoked by Williamson 1999 in the context of a discussion of truthmaker theory; and Künne 2003: chapter 6 makes a sustained case for its legitimacy, before using it to state a theory of truth that could well be classed as deflationist.)

Let me now turn to Jago's argument for the existence of states of affairs. Jago starts off by persuading us that there are properties. His argument is a familiar one: our ordinarily talk of 'ways for things to be' and 'things that other things have in common' implies their existence. Jago considers whether those who reject properties can resist this conclusion by appealing to second-order quantification: could they say that Bertie and John have something in common by saying '∃X (Bertie X and John X)'? Jago rapidly concludes that they cannot. His first reason is that there is no way of reading the quantification here except as committing its user to the existence of properties. His second reason is that once we appeal to second-order quantification, we can no longer deny that there are no properties, because second-order resources do not suffice to make such a denial (62-3).

I have to say that I find both arguments over-hasty. Jago presupposes that second-order quantification should be understood in terms of first-order quantification; he does not discuss the idea that second-order quantification might instead be a conceptual primitive (see Jones 2018 for a detailed development of this view). That strikes me as another significant omission. I suspect that this discussion, and Jago's attack on deflationism, would look very different if Jago factored in the possibility of primitive higher-order quantification.

Jago's second reason for rejecting the appeal to second-order quantification seems only to apply to a particular version of that appeal: the version that claims that ordinary talk apparently involving reference to and nominal quantification over properties is to be interpreted as second-order quantification. I can see that expressibility worries arise for that position. But what if the nominalist does not make that claim about interpretation, and so maintains that 'There are no properties' is a first-order truth? Such a nominalist might say that apparent reference to properties is something forced on us by expressive defects in natural language, such as the lack of a device for second-order quantification. Given that the existence of properties is crucial to Jago's overall project, I would have expected his discussion to be more fully buttressed at this point.

Similar remarks apply to Jago's arguments for states of affairs. Let me give one example. Jago says that states of the world are causes, and then argues that these states are not properties, since it is the possession (or gaining or losing) of a property that is a cause, not the property itself (70-1). There is no mention of the (hardly eccentric) view that causes are events. And if that view is right, then it seems that states of affairs are not required as causes. (Perhaps Jago thinks that some states of affairs are events; but he does not say so.) Because states of affairs play such an important role in the overall argument of the book, I expected some more here. To be fair to Jago, he does suggest in addition that the merits of his account in dealing with semantic paradoxes provide an indirect argument for states of affairs (72).

Once he has states of affairs in his ontology, Jago needs there to be enough of them to serve as truthmakers for every truth. He argues that we should posit negative states of affairs: Jago argues (131-154) that these provide a superior account of truthmaking for negative existentials than the alternatives (such as Armstrong's 'totality states of affairs').

Suppose we accept that there are states of affairs. What is their nature? The book provides a careful discussion of three answers one might give to that question: that states of affairs are made of particulars and relations connected by a 'fundamental tie' (Armstrong); that states of affairs are primitive, in the sense of being unstructured (Brian Skyrms, Jason Turner); that they are mereological sums with sequences as parts (a suggestion Jago sympathetically develops). Jago stays neutral on these accounts until he comes to discuss negative states of affairs, when he concludes that only the 'fundamental tie' and primitivist theories can accommodate these (154-160). The primitivist account posits non-actual states of affairs (129), and the 'fundamental tie' account posits uninstantiated properties (156). So either way we are going to end up with a rich ontology.

Jago argues for the identity of being true with having a truthmaker on the basis that this identity explains a number of platitudes about truth, such as the instances of the schema

<A> is true iff A

(where 'A' can be replaced by any sentence expressing a proposition, provided we bracket indexicality and other forms of context-dependence; the same caveat also applies to the other schemata below). Jago explains these instances by arguing that, once we accept his identity claim, we have the following chain of biconditionals: '<A> is true iff <A> has a truthmaker iff the state of affairs that A exists iff A' (75). He deals similarly with the instances of what Asay and Baron (forthcoming) call the 'B-schema':

<A> is true because A

(where 'A' can be replaced by any sentence expressing a true proposition). Jago writes:

underlying the monadic existential property having a truthmaker is the binary relation -- truthmakes --. An entity x stands in the first argument place when the proposition in the second argument place is true in virtue of x's existence. This 'in virtue of' is used canonically to express metaphysical explanations. We may replace 'is true in virtue of x's existence' with 'is true because x exists'. And there we have our explanation for the platitude, having assumed [the identity of being true with having a truthmaker]. (76)

This crucial passage is not as explicit as it might be. I take it that what Jago has in mind here is a chain of explanations along the following lines:

<A> is true because <A> has a truthmaker because the state of affairs that A exists because A.

For instance, that dogs bark explains the existence of the state of affairs that dogs bark; this state of affairs serves as truthmaker for <dogs bark>; and so it is because dogs bark that <dogs bark> is true.

In arguing for his identity claim, Jago restricts himself to the explanation of platitudes about truth. At this point in the dialectic, He has already argued for truthmaker maximalism (which is certainly not a platitude). Jago's identity claim, if true, is perfectly suited to explain why truthmaker maximalism is the case. All truths have truthmakers. Why? Because to be true just is to have a truthmaker. (Compare: why is it that every aunt is someone's aunt? Because what it is to be an aunt is to be the aunt of someone or other.) So I think Jago could bolster his case for the identity claim by adding maximalism to the list of explananda. (Above, I said 'at this point in the dialectic' because Jago's defence of maximalism actually comes later in the text than his argument for the identity claim. But if maximalism is false then the identity claim is false too, and thus not a good explanation of anything; indeed, the argument for the identity claim explicitly assumes maximalism (76).)

When it comes to explaining the instances of the B-schema, I worry that Jago does not meet the need for explanation, but, rather, relocates it. Jago connects '<A> is true' with 'A' by interposing a state of affairs: the existence of the state of affairs that A is because A, and it in turn explains the truth of <A>. But it could be argued that the instances of the following are just as in need of explanation as the instances of the B-schema:

The state of affairs that A exists because A

(where 'A' can be replaced by any sentence expressing a true proposition). These connections are the final links in Jago's explanatory chains. On his view, when I make a sandwich, I always make a state of affairs, too; and if my attempt to make a sandwich should fail, I will definitely manage to make a state of affairs anyway. In virtue of what do these regularities obtain? If there is nothing to be said to explain these connections, then we might worry that Jago's account is no advance on simply declaring the instances of the B-schema to be explanatorily basic. (Jago comes close to doing so when he claims that 'It's of the very nature of propositions that their truth or falsity depends on specific ways the world is' (85) -- a remark which threatens to make redundant the postulation of states of affairs in explaining the instances of the B-schema.)

One way to avoid this demand for explanation would be to invoke a notion of metaphysical equivalence: using this, one could claim that, quite generally, that 'A' and 'The state of affairs that A exists' are metaphysically equivalent; and to argue on that basis that 'The state of affairs that A exists' and 'A' are explanatorily equivalent, which would cut the final link from each explanatory chain. More discussion is needed than I can provide here, but I will simply note that the book does not develop any such notion, or show that it has the needed consequences for explanation.

The book concludes with a critical survey of approaches to the paradoxes of truth. Jago's own response to the Liar is a version of the claim that Liar sentences do not express propositions. What is new is that Jago derives this claim from his theory of truth together with his account of the nature of propositions. Briefly (and simplifying slightly), this account holds that a proposition is the set of its possible truthmakers. A proposition is true just in case one of its members exists (250). (This account is in the tradition of Kit Fine's 'truthmaker semantics' -- indeed, Jago cites joint work with Fine.)

Jago's theory of propositions seems to point away from actualism: propositions that are not true contain no actual existents, but only merely possible existents such as the state of affairs that there is a hippo in the room. However, in Jago's favoured version of the theory, these mere possibilia are replaced by actually existing substitutes. These are natures of states of affairs. This room doesn't contain a hippo, so there is no such thing as the state of affairs that there is a hippo in this room; but, on Jago's view, the nature of this state of affairs still actually exists and is a member of various propositions. It is just that this nature is unrealized -- until someone brings a hippo in here. On Jago's favoured version of his theory, then, a proposition is true just in case one of its members is realized (265-6).

Jago draws on his theory of the nature of truth to argue that no Liar sentence could have a truthmaker (309-10), and he concludes that there is no proposition for such sentences to express. 'It's not the Liar's fault: it tries to say something, but the world doesn't cooperate' (309). Jago also deals with the truth-teller and other paradox-generating sentences by arguing that, since being true is having a truthmaker, they could have no truthmaker and so they express no proposition (310-312).

Jago's views on propositions and paradox raise some questions I would have liked him to address. First of all, why does the empty set not count as a proposition? And since, on Jago's view, truthmakers do not always have to be states of affairs, why do propositions contain natures of states of affairs only? Finally, once natures of states of affairs are in our ontology, why couldn't we simply identify <there is a hippo in this room> with the nature of the state of affairs that there is a hippo in this room?

The book is a major contribution to metaphysics and to alethiology. It is packed with stimulating arguments. It is written in a lively style: for instance, negative states of affairs are characterized as 'the bad boys of metaphysics' (11). It will be accessible to those who are not already familiar with the debates it addresses. And, if any further inducement to read the book should be needed, let me close by mentioning that it contains absolutely no footnotes or endnotes.


Thanks to Jeroen Smid and Mark Jago for comments on an earlier draft.


Armstrong, D.M. 1989. Universals: An Opinionated Introduction. Boulder: Westview Press.

Asay, Jamin and Sam Baron forthcoming. Deflating deflationary truthmaking. Philosophical Quarterly.

Jago, Mark 2012. The non-maximalist's dilemma. Mind 121: 903-18.

Jones, Nicholas K. 2018. Nominalist realism. Noûs 52: 808-835.

Künne, Wolfgang 2003. Conceptions of Truth. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Simpson, Matthew 2014. Defending truthmaker nonmaximalism. Thought 3: 288-291.

Skiles, Alexander 2014. Is there a dilemma for the truthmaker non-maximalist? Synthese 191: 3649-3659.

Williamson, Timothy 1999. Truthmakers and the converse Barcan formula. Dialectica 53: 253-270.