What We Mean By Experience

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Marianne Janack, What We Mean By Experience, Stanford University Press, 2012, 216pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804776158.

Reviewed by Edrie Sobstyl, Douglas College


It is obvious that any major concept in philosophy changes over time, and that in different contexts, different writers will emphasize competing aspects of any particular concept. These developments lead to disagreements, tensions, and new directions, and are simply part of what it means to do philosophical analysis. Yet many important philosophical concepts are, for at least some periods of time, taken for granted to such an extent that it becomes easy to assume that there is a broad consensus about, for example, what we mean by experience. Marianne Janack's book is thus very aptly titled, as it draws our attention to the assumptions we make about the nature of experience and the role it plays in our theorizing about knowledge, language, and the mental. Janack's work disrupting such assumptions is so deft and provocative that the book should inspire readers to rethink the way they teach and write about experience, and even to reread primary sources that may have been neglected since graduate school.

Janack begins with the proviso that her aim in writing the book is to develop a particular narrative arc about the concept of experience. She acknowledges that the issues and sources she considers are not intended to be exhaustive, as we should expect with so broad a notion as experience, and for the most part this deliberate narrowing of focus is quite effective. In fact, for such a circumscribed treatment Janack's discussion covers a significant range of views. Of course, depending on one's background and favoured texts and theorists, not every reader will be entirely satisfied with this strategy, and the level of dissatisfaction -- or forgiveness -- will vary. (For example, I thought Janack gave feminist empiricism and pragmatism short shrift, but in the context of her overall argument, much of which deals at length with issues of concern to feminist epistemologists, this wasn't a big deal. On the other hand, Wilfrid Sellars' influential work on the given, which underpins the views of some of the writers Janack examines, would strengthen and enrich Janack's approach if explored in more detail. Janack is very interested in the connection between experience and agency, and this connection is crucial to Sellars' epistemology.)

Experience is a foundational idea for so much of philosophy that it can be easy to miss the ways in which it has been transformed and distorted by competing views of knowledge, language and the mind that have emerged in the last hundred years. As Janack puts it, "the concept of experience went from being the most useful concept for philosophical purposes to being one of the most neglected or vilified concepts over the course of the twentieth century". (21) Experience was once thought to play an authoritative role in many epistemologies, for example, but how can it do so? In what way are the theories we make answerable to the world we experience? Thanks to the rise of anti-foundationalism and the linguistic turn, questions like these have led some to reject concerns about reference, representation, and realism, in favour of an exclusive focus on discourse. Others turned to naturalized epistemologies, starting with their focus on stimuli. The actual disputes here are more nuanced than this, to be sure, but it's this broad division between discourse-philosophy and stimulus-philosophy that Janack challenges. It turns out that there is less to this distinction than meets the eye, and that when we get caught up in thinking otherwise, we lose the critical normative and practical dimension that the concept of experience can and should contribute to philosophy.

Janack presents both historical and critical threads throughout her discussion. The careful narrative arc that she tracks does get lost in this blend in a few places, but for the most part the critical analysis follows or at least complements the historical one. She begins with the pragmatist projects of William James and John Dewey, who sought to rescue experience from the British empiricists and square it with a more intertwined relationship between the subject and the world. This was a rich, fertile, and deeply human way of thinking about experience, emphasizing our individual and communal projects, and the agency required to engage in any activities at all. It was also, as Janack notes, pretty naïve. But what displaced it especially following Kuhn was either suspicion of the very notion of experience, or the careful redefinition and containment of experience within the secure confines of the natural sciences. Neither of these options is especially useful. Indeed, they're not even all that different. As Janack shows, whether we trade in epistemology for hermeneutics or subsume epistemology within science, we have surrendered all hope of an account of experience that takes seriously the fact that we are embodied agents who are typically involved in the world.

A series of chapters serve as case studies to illustrate what is at stake here. A brief account of the Fodor-Churchland debate over the impact of language on our experience of the world shows that such disputes are unlikely to be resolved by more empirical data. This is despite the fact that both theorists are committed to materialist approaches to understanding the mind or, to put it another way, they fall squarely within the stimulus camp. The bigger problem is the impoverished notion of experience that both parties hold, one that equates experience (and knowledge) with mere states of the brain. Experience should be understood as involving our bodies and the world, the actions that we take and not just our brains. While Janack doesn't contribute anything new to this part of the discussion, the case neatly illustrates the unifying theme of her book: abandoning a robust account of experience is a mistake. The error here is not scientism, a concern that has been raised in the past about the influence of cognitive science on philosophy of mind. Rather, Janack points out that attempts to naturalize parts of philosophy simply don't go far enough. Why should we think that scientific accounts of brain states can tell us anything useful about what it means to have experience as an embodied actor in the world?

The second case is more detailed and in some respects more surprising. Janack contrasts the theories of language acquisition adopted by Quine, Kuhn, and Rorty. It's pretty common to see these three theorists grouped together historically, and most readers will be familiar with differences and similarities among their views. Janack shows us an important similarity, that all three are committed to views of language acquisition that are not naturalistic, not even genuinely empirical. The problem is not just that Quine, for example, relies on an outdated body of evidence in describing holophrastic learning in children (although he surely does). Janack suggests that Quine's behaviourist account of language learning is philosophical speculation, "an a priori premise masked as an empirical claim". (76) The same can be said of Kuhn's story, where children are thought to be like computers being programmed by stimuli. The "evidence" in favour of this approach is even weaker -- Kuhn once almost programmed a computer to do this, so that is what children do. In Rorty the problem is somewhat different, since he is on the discourse side of the stimulus-discourse divide. Rorty doesn't follow Quine and Kuhn in thinking that empirical science is a good resource for philosophy, but he still accepts the impoverished view of experience that both Quine and Kuhn embrace. For Rorty, discourse is all about social practice, so experience is irrelevant. It's just one of the many rather dull things that we, along with other animals, can do with our brains. (78) The result of this widespread disregard for experience when it comes to language is a glaring omission of "the essential role of agency and normativity in understanding how language and 'the world' come together." (69-70) Janack's exploration of the dire consequences of this omission is clear, compelling, and worthwhile.

The final case considers the role of experience in feminist theorizing about identity and knowledge. Janack points out that "the claim that experience is always political is as close to a cornerstone of twentieth- and twenty-first-century feminist theory and politics as we are likely to come". (111) But what does this mean? Is gendered experience part of how we are programmed, or an uninteresting thing that our brains do, or something else? Among feminist philosophers there has perhaps been more attention to the concept of experience in the last two decades, but this isn't entirely because feminists take experience more seriously. The concept is of interest because it has become entangled in other issues, especially worries about gender essentialism. Joan Scott, for example, has been very skeptical about the value of experience to feminist theory. While Scott's concerns about the universalizing potential of experience-talk may be well-founded, Janack argues that it's not the concept of experience per se that poses a risk. It's the anemic version of experience, the legacy of anti-foundationalism and the linguistic turn, that leaves us with no safe, satisfying and politically fruitful way to talk about gendered experience. Ultimately Scott's rejection of a misconceived form of experience is as dangerous to feminism as gender essentialism. The subject becomes a mere discursive effect, not an agent, and not someone who can be responsible for her beliefs. Janack examines Donna Haraway's efforts to redeem vision as a richer model (or perhaps metaphor) for experience, but her project too falls short of fully exploring the ways in which experience is tied up with agency. Haraway's famed enthusiasm for technological enhancement as a means to understand and liberate the human may show a little more interest in the actions and intentions of embodied knowers in the world, but it's still not sufficient. Lorraine Code's approach to naturalizing epistemology, which requires that we take the full range of human activity more seriously, comes closest to the ideal that Janack defends.

All of this matters not just for feminist political goals, but for philosophy more generally, and the bridge between these issues and larger epistemological and metaphysical questions leads neatly into the final two chapters of the book. Janack argues that experience must place some rational constraint on knowledge (117), and that it must be recognized as natural, social, and practical, together (118). Without this perspective, our beliefs make no contact with the world. So let's have a naturalized approach to experience, she declares, but let's stop assuming that choosing this approach means abandoning normativity. If we have come with her this far, then we can easily see that Janack's version of naturalism is necessarily evaluative from the ground up. (123) Janack introduces John McDowell's view of human nature, and the preceding discussion helps to isolate and amplify the relevant aspects of McDowell's somewhat baroque project. McDowell doesn't entirely escape the false dichotomy between experience as something that just happens to us, and experience as what discursively justifies our beliefs, but in his work we can find some of the tools needed to understanding experience as an encounter between the subject and the world, where the subject "also has a prior commitment to an understanding of herself as part of, and accountable to, the world". (140) (Janack also discusses McDowell's use, or perhaps misappropriation, of Sellars' metaphor of logical space and Simon Blackburn's objections to McDowell. This would be a good place to examine Sellars' views more directly.)

Carried forward from earlier chapters is Janack's defense of a first-person perspective as necessarily part of any understanding of experience worth having. This view will certainly challenge widely-held views among both feminist and non-feminist philosophers. Janack argues that giving up the first-person stance, as Scott and Rorty do, is inconsistent with attributions of agency. We may, with Rorty, act as amateur anthropologists, observing the linguistic performances of self and others from an impersonal perspective. We may, like Scott, prefer to take a more literary approach to the narratives that we and others offer. Either way, we must recognize that experience brings with it language, meaning, agency, and accountability to others and to the world, and without a first-person perspective we give up any interesting account of experience and its associated concepts. This may be one of the more tendentious parts of Janack's argument, and not everyone will accept it, but it is surely worth having made. At the very least there are important questions about individualism lurking in the background here.

A book-length critical essay sometimes ends in hand waving, with gestures toward future work and optimistic remarks about how things can proceed now that the initial heavy lifting has been done. So it is very encouraging to see Janack's book conclude with substantive discussion of alternative understandings of experience rather than a mere sketch. Inspired by recent work by Philip Robbins and Murat Aydede, Susan Hurley, Alva Noë, and others, Janack recommends "situated cognition". She also explores an associated array of intriguing concepts including affordance and enactivism, as well as new and embodied approaches to vision and the environment. The very term "situated" is common enough in contemporary philosophy, especially among feminists, but Janack forces us to think far more concretely about what it means to defend situatedness as a superior way to understand experience and knowledge. Exactly what is the nature of the thing that is situated? Exactly what is this thing situated in, and in what way? For Janack, the answers are clear. The situated subject requires a first-person analysis in order to guarantee agency and responsibility. This agent is situated bodily in an environment that imposes constraints on what is experienced and on what can be known, and this agent acts with intention to realize epistemic and other goals. These goals, and the agent's actions aimed at them, are meaningful and can be adjudicated on normative grounds. The naïve pragmatism of James and Dewey, with which Janack's discussion began, can be fully and informatively naturalized, but only if we recapture what we mean by experience.