Will MacAskill’s new book starts with a bang. He claims that a moral revolution is coming, if we take seriously three innocent-looking claims: ‘Future people count. There could be lots of them. We can make their lives better’ (9). These form the basis of longtermism, according to which ‘positively influencing the longterm future is a key priority of our time’ (4).
The book then lays out the case for longtermism in great detail and explores its supposedly far-reaching implications for how we should think and act, often by using captivating pedagogical analogies, metaphors, and illustrations. One particularly memorable analogy likens humanity to a youth with a long and prosperous future ahead, if only she makes the right decisions now. On the other hand, if she makes the wrong decisions, her future might be very bleak, or perhaps even end prematurely. One of the overarching themes in the book is that, as with individual humans, in order to make the right decision humanity needs to be concerned not just with the quality of its future life, by effecting what MacAskill calls ‘trajectory changes’ to its life, but also with ensuring its survival, by extending its life span.
The book is divided into five parts. The first part succinctly presents the case for longtermism and argues that we have the power to change the course of history for humanity. In the second and third parts, MacAskill discusses the various ways humanity can shape its own future, by effecting trajectory changes. More specifically, drawing on lessons from history, he argues that a dynamic of ‘early plasticity, later rigidity’ could be true for human history as a whole, highlighting the need not to be ‘locked into’ the wrong set of values. A prominent example of possible value-lock in is that of a takeover by a technologically advanced immortal AI system, a possibility that is also taken seriously by some prominent AI-researchers and developers.
In the third part, the focus is more on the life span of humanity. MacAskill discusses the risk of human extinction, but also the risks of other bad endings for humanity: collapse or stagnation of human civilization.
The fourth part discusses a possible argument for the claim that it is important to ensure that the life span of the humanity is as long as possible, provided that the quality of life is good, namely that it is bad to prevent (sufficiently) good lives from being created. This, MacAskill acknowledges, is a controversial view, but he argues that it is better than the alternatives by alluding to some recent results in population ethics. He also argues for a measured optimism about the future: we have some reason to think that the expected value of the future is positive.
The final part provides some more concrete advice about what we should do if we want to follow the credo of longtermism. MacAskill argues that when deciding which problems to work on, it is not just the importance of the problem that matters. One also needs to consider how tractable and neglected the problem is. He also argues for private donations, for choosing a high-impact career, and for joining with others in a longtermist movement.
The above bare-bones summary does not do justice to the richness of the book, which is replete with enlightening historical examples, scientific findings, and intriguing thought experiments and persuasive arguments (collected with the assistance of a team of co-workers).
My overall impression of the book is that it succeeds in its main aim of making a good case for longtermism and working out some of its most important implications, given some of the latest scientific and historical research. It is written for a general audience, and he does a very good job at explaining complex ideas in plain terms that are accessible to non-experts.
However, as always, there is scope for improvement. The philosophical discussion is a bit unclear at times and there are some significant omissions. Let us start with the omissions. One glaring omission is the absence of any discussion or mention of intergenerational justice and equality. This is especially odd, since the title of the book suggests that we owe things to the future, but owing is commonly understood in terms of justice. You owe someone something if it would be unjust not to give it to them. The focus in the book is instead on the wellbeing of future people. Nothing wrong with that, of course; beneficence is after all an important part of morality. But the selling point of longtermism should not hang on whether one thinks the promotion of wellbeing is the only, or the most, important matter. Considerations of justice and equality can also be applied to future generations, including those in the very far future, and there is a long tradition of research on how to work out the details of intergenerational justice (for a recent collection of papers on this topic, see Gosseries and Meyer 2009). One popular idea is that justice requires us to make sure (if we can) that future generations, no matter how far in the future they exist, have at least a decent quality of life. This omission can be remedied by adding more material to the website that accompanies the book, https://whatweowethefuture.com/uk/, and MacAskill is planning to do just that (private conversation).
Another omission is the lack of a more thorough discussion of institutional changes required to tackle the challenges for humanity, both present and future. MacAskill does discuss the need for institutional reforms to avoid value lock-in (99). But he does not say much about the need for institutional reforms to tackle other threats to humanity. The chapter on what to do about these is focused on individual action or individual actions as parts of a political movement. However, it seems clear that preventing climate change or the takeover by intelligent AI-systems requires reforms of legal, political, and economic institutions, at both national and international levels.
A more general proposal for institutional reform is to make sure that the interests of future generations are always factored into political decisions. The problem is that they do not exist yet and cannot defend their own interests. That problem, however, can be solved. One could, for example, introduce an ombudsman for future generations whose job it is to defend their interests when major political decisions are made. We already have an ombudsman for children, who of course are also often unable to defend their own interests in the political process. An ombudsman for future generations could function in a similar way. But it could also become mandatory that important parliamentary votes and legislation are preceded by an assessment of how the decisions and changes will affect future generations. It would have been interesting to know what MacAskill thinks about these institutional reforms.
What I found a bit unclear in the philosophical discussion was the idea of the moral revolution that is supposed to follow, if we take seriously the trinity of ideas introduced at the outset of the book, again that future people count, there could be lots of them, and we can make their lives better. These ideas are far from revolutionary. Not many would deny that there could be lots of people and that we can make future lives better. And, as MacAskill himself acknowledges, it is not revolutionary to say that future people count, since it is already recognized as part of common-sense morality that time itself is not morally relevant. That someone is harmed does not matter less just because the person happens to exist in the future. The idea that future people count, even significantly, has also been enshrined in many policy documents and treaties, for example in UN and EU declarations on a sustainable future for humanity. It is also part of the constitutions in some Nordic countries. For example, in the Swedish constitution, it is stated in the first chapter that:
Public institutions shall promote a sustainable development leading to a good environment for present and future generations. (my translation, the Swedish Constitution, Instrument of Government, Chapter 1, Paragraph 2)
So, at least with regards to our thinking, longtermism is already seen as a key priority. Of course, it is another matter whether our politicians act on this principle. Often they do not, mainly because of the short-sighted objective of securing victory in the next election. But I take it that longtermism itself is supposed to be revolutionary in some respects. It is not news to be told that we fail to live up to ideals we already are committed to.
MacAskill does introduce and defend some supplementary ideas that potentially have very far-reaching consequences. One is the idea that in the face of uncertainty we should maximize expected value (36–40). This in itself is not terribly controversial, but it becomes very controversial when the value of the possible outcomes is identified with longterm value, which is determined by looking at the wellbeing of all future generations in that outcome and summing them up, (which seems implicit in the account of longterm value presented on pp. 254–258). If our overall duty is to maximize the expected longterm value, then we should be willing to make huge sacrifices of the wellbeing of our contemporaries for the sake of a very small probability that generations in the far future will have extremely happy lives (or be very populous).
Now, MacAskill does not endorse the idea that this is our overall duty (even if one can get that impression from reading Chapter 2 and Appendix 3). He claims that longtermism is not meant to overthrow the moral principles that make up the core of common-sense morality: that we are allowed to be partial towards ourselves and our near and dear (11), that we should never violate rights, or harm people, for the sake of the good (260–261), and that we should be never be morally required to make sure more happy people are brought into existence (188). These principles would clearly come into conflict with an overall duty to maximize expected longterm value. To resolve this conflict, we must then say that we only have a prima facie duty to maximize expected longterm value, one that is not strong enough to override important common-sense constraints. MacAskill concedes that it is not clear in the end how much we should care about the future generations, only that ‘we should be doing much more to benefit future generations than we currently are’ (261). But exactly how much more could we do without coming into conflict with common-sense morality? After all, common-sense morality gives us permission to be partial to our near and dear, here and now, and does not require, but only permits, us to undertake costly heroic actions for the benefit of strangers, far away in space or time.
Of course, this might show that common-sense morality has to be reformed. This is how many moral revolutions in past have been brought about, after all. Think of animal liberation and the emancipation of women, for example. But MacAskill does not say anything about these difficult trade-off issues, with one exception. He maintains that if you are morally uncertain about which of two conflicting principles is the correct one, it is reasonable to opt for the best compromise between them, which would be the action that maximizes the highest expected moral choiceworthiness (187). However, this approach appears to give the expected value-principle a clear advantage over common-sense morality, since so much is at stake when we can affect the shape and life span of future humanity. It is thus not clear that common-sense will have much of a say when our actions can affect an enormous number of future people, even if the probability of this outcome is very small.
Another supplementary idea that MacAskill defends has a greater claim to being revolutionary. This is the idea that preventing the existence of a (sufficiently) good life is a moral loss, and not something neutral. This does not follow from the idea that future people count, since future people can count in the sense that one should consider the wellbeing of those future people whose existence is not up to oneself and try to make them better off. But making sure a good life is created, that is, not preventing it from existing, is not to make the person in this life better off—one cannot be better off existing than not existing. This idea takes us far beyond common-sense morality. For when we reason in common-sense morality, we assume that the important thing is to make things better for people, and to not make things worse for them. When we talk about helping those in need, we assume that we ought to make things better for them. When we discuss bringing about a fair distribution of wealth, by taking from the rich and giving to the poor, we assume that we can make things worse for the rich but that this is outweighed by the fact that we’re making things so much better for the poor. When we talk about not violating people’s rights to a tolerable life, we assume that we have a duty not to make things worse for them. To endorse the idea that it could be a moral loss to prevent someone’s existence, even if it does not make anyone worse off, would therefore be to revise common-sense morality significantly.
MacAskill does a pretty good job at introducing non-experts to the perplexities of population ethics, that is, the ethics of assessing population changes. But he has only one chapter to devote to it. So, it is unavoidable that the discussion is compressed. Drawing on existing results in population ethics, MacAskill argues for the claim that preventing a good life is a moral loss, at least in the sense that it makes things worse. But he goes further than that. He also tentatively argues that the value of a population equals the sum of the wellbeing of its members, (possibly adjusted by a critical positive level above which a life makes a positive contribution and below which it makes a negative one). But he has very little space to discuss various alternatives to this utilitarian aggregation principle. So, as evidenced by various reviews of his book, he has been unsuccessful in convincing people (including professional philosophers), who lack background in population ethics and are not initially attracted to utilitarian thinking (see, for instance, Setiya 2022).
The book’s website lists several valuable additional references that provide more thorough background to MacAskill’s central arguments, but I think it would have been beneficial to include those additional references in the book itself so that newcomers to the discussion could more clearly see that the alternative aggregation principles also have serious problems. Some supplementary material in an appendix to make the arguments more convincing would also have been useful. This is, after all, not a small detail in the longtermist package MacAskill wants to sell us. Without these ideas, our moral concern for the future will look quite different. For example, if future people count only in the sense that one should consider the wellbeing of those future people whose existence is not up to oneself and try to make them better off, then preventing or adding good or bad lives without making anyone better or worse off will not have any bearing on our decisions. Or, if future people count also in the sense that we should prevent the existence of bad future lives, then we can still ignore the effects our actions will have on the creation of good lives.
To conclude, MacAskill has written an accessible book that is brimming with ideas about why and how future generations matter significantly. To the best of my knowledge, no other book addresses both the empirical and philosophical issues surrounding longtermism so comprehensibly, while also sketching the practical applications which follow from these considerations. Undoubtedly, this is a very ambitious undertaking, and even if some of the philosophical ideas could have been explored in greater depth, my overall impression of the book is still a positive one. The urgency of the issues discussed in the book cannot be underestimated. As MacAskill emphasizes in his concluding remarks:
This is a time when we can be pivotal in steering the future onto a better trajectory. There’s no better time for a movement that will stand up, not just for our generation or even our children’s generation, but for all those who are yet to come. (246)
Gosseries, A. and L. H. Meyer. (2009) Intergenerational Justice. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
Greaves, H., & MacAskill, W. (2021). The case for strong longtermism [GPI Working Paper No . 5–2021]. Global Priorities Institute, Oxford University. https://globalprioritiesinstitute.org/wp-content/uploads/The-Case-for-Strong-Longtermism-GPI-Working-Paper-June-2021-2-2.pdf
Setiya, Kieran, ‘The new moral mathematics’. Boston Review, August 15, 2022 https://www.bostonreview.net/articles/the-new-moral-mathematics/)
Swedish Constitution, https://www.riksdagen.se/en/how-the-riksdag-works/democracy/the-constitution/