The COVID-19 pandemic upended life across the globe. In the crossover book, What World Is This? A Pandemic Phenomenology, Judith Butler explores not just what happened, but what we ought to make of it. What are the ethical and political lessons this shared trauma offers and what do these lessons tell us both about how things are and also how they might be? Throughout, the inquiry weaves effortlessly between intellectual history, cultural critique, philosophical analysis, and political theory. As longtime readers of Butler will expect, their arguments ebb and flow around a host of rich, interlocking questions. The question in the title, What world is this? is expectedly primary, but a good deal of time is spent on more general questions like What is a world? as well as more specific questions linked to Butler’s previous work such as What makes a life grievable? In many ways, this book demonstrates that the stakes of the latter question cannot be appreciated without that which should be thought of as its conceptual twin: What makes a life livable?
What World Is This? will appeal not just to philosophers and those in the humanities or social sciences, but to a general readership interested in questions like these and how philosophy can help us think them through. After briefly summarizing each of the chapters, I will take up a number of themes and questions Butler raises in relation to work in the philosophy of disability and disability studies.
The introduction lays down the project’s stakes quickly: it is nothing less than an investigation of what it is to be human, what it means to live and die, and how each of those queries have been shaped by the global proliferation of a certain novel, severe, and acute respiratory syndrome of the virus family Coronaviridae. Butler ends the introduction on a methodological note. Of all the ways “the world,” and specifically this world, might be investigated as an object of inquiry—via “geography, astronomy, world literature, systems theory, environmental science”—this project is phenomenological, which is to say, lived experience will take center stage.
Chapter 1 places Max Scheler’s understanding of tragedy in conversation with Maurice Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenological research, especially his investigations and arguments concerning touch, embodiment, and intersubjectivity. For Scheler, the world is tragic. For Merleau-Ponty, the world is enfleshed and intertwined. For Butler, it could be said that the human condition is one of tragic entanglement. This insight leads to the core claim of the chapter and, ultimately, the book: “the possibility of a livable life depends upon an inhabitable world” (29). The conditions for habitability require analysis, to be sure, but the basics are simple. Butler’s list (32ff) unsurprisingly matches up nicely with the affordances deemed requisite by mainstream human rights and capabilities approaches. And the upshot is fundamentally communitarian: “If the pandemic gives us one rather large social and ethical lesson to learn. . .[it is that] what makes a life livable is a question that implicitly shows us that the life we live is never exclusively our own, that the conditions for a livable life have to be secured, and not just for me but for lives and living processes more generally” (43). Chapter 2 takes up the same questions but brings racialization and climate change into focus. Engaging Achille Mbembe’s work on necropolitics, Butler lays out an account of the immiseration of the working-class combined with an appreciation for how systemic racism defines the past, present, and future of who is most likely to be in that class. Police violence, racism in healthcare delivery, and growing inequality skewed detrimentally for historically oppressed groups are not separate phenomena. They are all linked (51ff). Scheler and Merleau-Ponty (as well as Spinoza) return in this chapter in an attempt to better understand this imbrication. Butler shows how it’s not just that COVID-19 palpably demonstrated our existential, highly personal lack of control over how and where we find ourselves in the world—it also palpably highlighted the systems, both local and global, that create, maintain, and amplify radical inequality and injustice along lines of racialization and colonization (60ff).
Chapter 3 is addressed most directly to philosophers, for it spends a good deal of time on internecine debates over phenomenological method. Of course, Butler is not referring to “phenomenological” in the banal sense of the term (still confusingly deployed in certain philosophical circles) where one means simply describing the “what it’s like” of X experience, where X might be seeing red or being a bat. The tradition of phenomenology indeed privileges “what it’s like,” the felt contours of lived experience, but it does so as an entry point on the way to its real goal: understanding the general structures of experience. As Butler argues, classical, post-classical, and, most recently, critical phenomenological approaches employ different ways to move from the descriptive to the reconstructive, and they also interpret the “general” in reconstructed “general structures” in distinct ways. Having said all this, Butler aligns themselves with critical phenomenology (Magrì and McQueen, 2022). What, precisely, critical phenomenology is and whether or not it’s truly distinct from classical or post-classical phenomenology is a point of debate in the literature. But the upshot of this chapter for readers who both care about phenomenology as well as those who don’t is simple: a focus on lived experience provides a powerful corrective to utilitarian market logics that reduce people to numbers, input/outputs, and outcomes. One way to fight the “let die” directive of modern governance that Foucault made famous in his definition of biopower is to insist—ethically and politically—on the import of experience.
Chapter 4 and the afterword add up to just twenty pages. They provide helpful connections with Butler’s earlier work (e.g., linking grievability with livability) as well as offering a wider ambit of concern for the book’s inquiries into Putin’s attack on Ukraine and the Ni una menos Latin American grassroots feminist movement, among other events.
While What World is This? admirably envisions and provides fecund critical inquiry towards a more just world, there is a significant missed opportunity in Butler’s analysis: disability. COVID-19 was, and still is, a mass disabling event unlike any other in recent history (Evans et al., 2022). It is also a disability event, not just a disabling event, unlike any other in recent history insofar as it raised significant consciousness concerning the importance of disability law both nationally and internationally. After the world shut down, a number of states in the US passed emergency declarations that targeted disabled people, especially people with intellectual disabilities. The response was swift, forceful, and well-publicized as disability activists, bioethicists, and public health officials together shot back, pointing out how these laws/declarations weren’t simply unethical, but flatly illegal (Guidry-Grimes et al., 2020). A similar set of events happened at the international level. A number of nation-states that are signatories to the United Nations Conventions on the Rights of Persons with Disability (UNCRPD) threw disabled people under the bus at their respective federal levels, leading the UN to quickly put out a forceful reminder that disability rights are human rights. Fast forward to the end of treating COVID-19 as a pandemic and the start of treating it as endemic: the primary social group “left to die” upon decisions to open back up was—and still is—disabled people with various immunological issues.
In addition to the centrality of disability to the political and governmental response to the pandemic, appreciation of its differential effect on groups demonstrated why not just disability, but debility is an essential analytic tool to tackle the question what world is this? Coined (in its critical form) by Jasbir Puar, the term captures the making-impaired essential to colonial nation-building. Whether the IDF attacking Palestinians in their homes, police officers in the USA attacking Black and Brown people, or border-control officers attacking migrants across the global North, debilitation is a central feature of this world (Puar, 2017). Indeed, many of the ethical claims Butler goes so far as to put in the assertoric and not just interrogative mode are claims more or less from disability activism and disability studies, such as the concept of and ethical demand for habitability (Garland-Thomson, 2015; Hendren, 2020). To call COVID-19 a mass disabling and mass disability event is not to fall into the ableist conflation of disability with pain and suffering (Reynolds, 2022). It is, quite to the contrary, to recognize that the world we live in is fundamentally eugenic. Social organization across the globe is not designed to care for all—it is designed to care for the privileged few, those who are judged to be the “good stock.” I find this line of analysis not only helpful, but necessary if we are to appreciate how we find ourselves and the world today.
In summary, my main complaint about What World Is This? A Pandemic Phenomenology doubles as a compliment: it’s too short. I genuinely look forward and hope to hear more from Butler on these topics, especially vis-à-vis how a disability justice framework and engagement with disability studies might inform our understanding of the world and our efforts to change it for the better. I specify change because this book continues Butler’s work, both in the academy and in the public sphere, carefully aimed at changing how we think in order to change how we act.
Although Butler’s own “I,” their first-person experience, is nearly always submerged, the prose resonates in an intensely personal manner, as if one can feel how we have all changed, for better or for worse. One can’t help but read this as a book of therapy—for the reader, for the author, for all of us. Of course, one must hear in this comment the reference to Wittgenstein’s claim in Philosophical Investigations that philosophy just is therapy. In that sense, this is a book of philosophy for all of us, a book we all need and need to think through.
Elisa Magrì and Paddy McQueen. 2022. Critical Phenomenology: An Introduction. Wiley.
Blake Hereth, Paul Tubig, Ashton Sorrels, Anna Muldoon, Kelly Hills, and Nicholas G. Evans. 2022. “Long Covid and Disability: A Brave New World.” BMJ 378.
Laura Guidry-Grimes, Katie Savin, Joseph A. Stramondo, Joel Michael Reynolds, Marina Tsaplina, Teresa Blankmeyer Burke, Angela Ballantyne, et al. 2020. “Disability Rights as a Necessary Framework for Crisis Standards of Care and the Future of Health Care.” Hastings Center Report 50 (3): 28–32.
United Nations’ Office of the High Commissioner, “COVID-19 and the Rights of Persons with Disabilities: Guidance.”
Joel Michael Reynolds and Rosemarie Garland-Thomson, “The Import of the UNCRPD and Disability Justice for Pandemic Preparedness and Response.”
Jasbir K. Puar. 2017. The Right to Maim: Debility, Capacity, Disability. ANIMA: Critical Race Studies Otherwise. Durham, NC: Duke University Press.
Rosemarie Garland-Thomson. 2015. “A Habitable World: Harriet McBryde Johnson’s ‘Case for My Life.’” Hypatia 30 (1): 300–306.
Sara Hendren. 2020. What Can a Body Do? Penguin Random House.
Joel Michael Reynolds. 2022. The Life Worth Living: Disability, Pain, and Morality. University of Minnesota Press.
Marta Russell. 2019. Capitalism and Disability. Haymarket Books.