When All Else Fails: The Ethics of Resistance to State Injustice

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Jason Brennan, When All Else Fails: The Ethics of Resistance to State Injustice, Princeton University Press, 2018, 269pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691181714.

Reviewed by Simone M. Sepe, University of Arizona


Jason Brennan’s book defends a very provocative idea: that individuals can react to government injustice by resisting it both passively and actively. He develops this idea through two main and complementary arguments. First, Brennan negates the special immunity thesis, under which government officials would enjoy special immunity against being deceived, lied to, sabotaged, attacked, or killed in self-defense or the defense of others. Second, he affirms the moral parity thesis, under which self-defense or the defense of others against government officials is on par with self-defense or the defense of others against civilians. Building on these arguments, he then maintains that civilians are justified, if not required, to undertake defensive actions against the government when this defense is warranted for social justice reasons. Civilians — Brennan suggestively argues — may assassinate presidents or high-ranking government officials if this serves to avoid unjust wars, use force against law enforcement officials if they try to arrest someone who has broken an unjust law, join the military or other bureaucratic apparatus for the sole of purpose of sabotaging the institution from within if the institution is corrupt, and undertake other similarly striking defensive actions.

After sketching the argument in Chapter 1, in Chapter 2 Brennan moves to define the scope of defensive ethics. He begins with physical self-defense, discussing the dimensions of “imminent threat” and “proportionality.” He then extends defensive ethics to cases of defensive lying, sabotage, theft, and destruction. In discussing defensive ethics examples — as well as other relevant examples in the rest of the book — he employs a common expository strategy revolving around parallel cases in which civilians and government officials respectively commit the supposed wrong. From a stylistic and argumentative perspective, this methodology is highly effective. I worry, however, that using intuitions about individual actions abstracted from any institutional context may fail to capture the essence of institutional cases, as these cases may be morally relevantly different.

Chapters 3 to 5 are devoted to debunking the special immunity thesis. The task is essential to Brennan’s argument, since only if the immunity thesis is proven false can the moral parity thesis be true. Chapter 3 begins the task by building on the dismissal of traditional theories of government legitimacy. For Brennan, social contract theory rests on an unrealistic conceptual apparatus, while Hart’s theory of government legitimacy fatally fails to consider that when rules are unjust, they cannot create any meaningful duty of obedience. Relatedly, Brennan also argues that government decisions affecting civilians’ lives cannot be legitimate when governments are incompetent — a conclusion that directly undermines the special immunity thesis.

Chapter 4 expands this line of reasoning. In particular, Brennan rejects the objection that defensive actions against the government are an instance of impermissible vigilante justice. For citizens cannot be obliged to defer to government officials when a government is not able to perform its basic functions. On the contrary, whenever a citizen has reasons to believe that a defensive action against government officials is warranted, this is a sufficient condition to undertake these actions.

Chapter 5 concludes this part of the analysis by considering whether there exists a case for a more limited form of special immunity, one granted to higher ranking government officials by reason of their authority against subordinates. Brennan’s answer is again negative, since in his view authority cannot provide immunity if it is used for unjust purposes. The conclusion extends to forms of authority that are grounded in the agents’ epistemic advantage rather than positions of power.

Chapters 6 and 7 focus on defensive strategies and actions permissible against government officials. Chapter 6 considers cases in which individuals strategically acquire power to implement defensive actions. For Brennan, this defensive strategy legitimately enables politicians to lie to voters or other government officials, if lying is instrumental to prevent injustice. He supports this conclusion with a diverse — but I am afraid not conclusive — body of evidence about the lack of political knowledge among American citizens and the damages that (the few) well-informed voters suffer under the one person-one vote principle.

Chapter 7 expands the domain of defensive lying to judgeship, on the argument that judges (including Justices) have the right to self-defend against unjust laws. From this perspective, Brennan seems to endorse a moderate version of the natural rights view, under which broad aspects of rights are taken as independent of positive law, but specifications of these rights are delegated to formal laws. And while Brennan only introduces the dimension of disagreement about individual rights at the very end of Chapter 7, he makes clear that the existence of democratic procedures to deal with disagreement does not offer a valid reason to defer to the external determination of such rights if the individual’s substantive justice perception suggests otherwise.

In the last chapter, Brennan takes up the important question of whether the self-defense of civilians against government officials is merely a right (enabling civilians with the option to act) or an obligation (mandating civilians to act). His response is that civilian resistance is a supererogatory act, so that civilians have a general obligation to act to reduce the amount of injustice in the world, but with significant discretion on how and when to act. For example, if a civilian is far from the perpetrated government injustice and/or the transaction costs of resistance are high, the undertaking of defensive actions is merely an option. Conversely, if the civilian is in proximity of the perpetrated injustice and/or bears low transaction costs for resisting, defensive ethics creates a moral obligation to act against the government. In practice, however, it might be difficult to draw precise lines across one case and the other of civilian resistance. As a consequence, Brennan argues that the morality of self-defense against government officials should follow a case by case approach.

Brennan’s book is well written and opens up an important public debate, although some of the ideas the book advances were previously explored in Huemer (2013). In particular, it is unclear how Brennan’s discussion of the government’s lack of authority and the view that substantive justice cannot be preempted by a procedural criterion of obedience to the law adds to Huemer’s own discussion of these topics. Similarly, Huemer also defends actions such as sabotaging jury deliberation as legitimate remedial actions against unjust laws.

The basic difficulty with Brennan’s discussion, however, lies in his defense of the moral parity thesis (and correspondingly his criticism of the special immunity thesis), which rests on a too quick dismissal of government legitimacy and a poor understanding of the coordination problems that would follow under a defensive ethics system. It is true that my criticism is dispelled when brutal dictatorships provide the foundation of government legitimacy, an extreme case in which I share Brennan’s rejection of the special immunity thesis. But Brennan seems to focus on democratic regimes rather than dictatorships. Under this assumption, I further argue that defensive lying, in particular, could jeopardize the functioning of democracy by negating the value of the rule of law.

Brennan offers a radical critique of the theories of government legitimacy. This critique, however, is arbitrarily narrow. He mainly focuses on classic social contract theory, while downplaying the importance of more modern accounts of the theory. He considers only Hart and explicit contract views, while virtually ignoring implied consent theories or pragmatic theories à la Joseph Raz and Allen Buchanan.

That the thesis of explicit consent to the social contract is hard to defend is quite apparent. For explicit consent can only occur at one point in time, if it occurs at all. History has indeed repeatedly exposed the inner contradiction of the Lockean argument in favor of a perpetual restrictive covenant on the land. Implied consent to the social contract, however, seems less difficult to defend, at least in most Western democracies. For consent is implied when an individual chooses not to opt out of a certain status (in this case, the participation in a certain political system), when the option to do so — although costly — is available. In Europe, for example, citizens can freely move across 28 different countries and national regimes. Similarly, American citizens can choose among 50 state governments. International immigration agreements expand the argument, although the point is weakened in non-democratic regimes, especially if immigration rules are very restrictive and opting out is only available through the right of asylum. But, again, Brennan does not distinguish between democratic and non-democratic systems in his discussion.

More fundamentally, Brennan does not engage with modern social contract theory. Rawls’s argument that the state’s coercive authority over a certain territory and individuals is defensible as long as the constitutional process preserves the equal representation of the individuals’ original position seems especially relevant here. Brennan might argue that Rawls reduces the collective choice problem to an individual problem, eliminating the possibility that individuals might disagree about their rights by assumption. But the social contract is not just a matter of consent about individual rights. Rather, it involves consensus regarding the nature of a society’s decision-making process. As Thomas Christiano says, democratic decision making has to be evaluated in terms of the way in which decisions are made. That is, political authority is defensible as long as the process of decision-making treats all of its members with equal respect and the institutions of legislative representation are fair. This conclusion seems directly relevant for Brennan’s defensive ethics discussion, as the democratic principle of equal respect would reduce, if not altogether eliminate, the need for civilian resistance.

Brennan likewise disregards other theories of government legitimacy and, in particular, the instrumentalist conception, which brings together political philosophy and game theoretical considerations about authority and coordination costs. As Raz puts it:

the normal way to establish that a person has authority over another person involves showing that the alleged subject is likely better to comply with reasons which already independently apply to him if he accepts the directives of the alleged authority as authoritatively binding and tries to follow them, rather than by trying to follow the reasons which apply to him directly.  (1986, 53)

The argument echoes the classic Lockean point that if each person were to judge whether to comply with laws based on her own, individual conception of justice, this would most likely lead to deep disagreement and massive discoordination, if not chaos altogether. Government legitimacy (rightful authority) helps solve this problem, as people can agree on criteria for legitimacy (especially in terms of sound process, procedures) even when they cannot agree on justice (of course, assuming that institutions or laws cannot be egregiously unjust and there can be agreement on what constitutes extreme or egregious injustice). As explained by Buchanan, legitimacy is thus a concept that facilitates “metacordination”: the coordination of belief as to what criteria an institution (or set of laws) must satisfy if it is to receive citizens’ support, support that is necessary if an institution is to fulfill its vital role of facilitating coordination (and do so without unacceptable levels of coercion).

Insight from game theory helps to further illustrate why government authority is the means toward a desirable social equilibrium, one which helps individuals to coordinate in order to realize their common goals. In a very influential article, Robert Aumann generalized the concept of Nash equilibrium through the concept of correlated equilibrium, a solution that allows players to achieve better payoffs. The basic intuition is the following. Players’ choices of pure strategies (e.g., cooperate, not-cooperate) may be correlated due to the fact that they use the same random events in deciding which pure strategy to play. Consider then an extended game that includes an “observer,” who recommends to each player a pure strategy she should play and where the vector of recommended strategies is chosen according to a probability distribution over the set of pure strategies.1 In our applied context, government authority is the device enabling individuals to correlate and avoid undesirable (non-cooperative) payoff outcomes. Thus, were all citizens to act according to their own perception of justice, the general equilibrium consequences could be very severe.

Game theory offers yet another argument in favor of the special immunity thesis. From a strategy perspective, a government official’s threat of coercion against civilians is what makes the threat credible and ultimately protects social order. However, this conclusion does not hold if the threat can be neutralized by a counteraction and the possibility of undertaking this counteraction is common knowledge. In this case, the game between government officials and civilians is no longer “subgame perfect,” with the result that multiple equilibria exist (i.e., anything can happen) and social disorder becomes a likely outcome. Brennan, however, seems inclined to think that government officials do not abide by the moral ideals one would expect from them, while civilians are likely to be motivated by good purposes. Surprisingly, he does not consider the adverse selection implications of the moral parity thesis when bad civilians (those motivated by opportunistic motives) mimic good civilians (those motivated by substantive justice motives).

Further, Brennan’s assumption about the behavior of government officials largely overlooks the weight of standards of conduct that mandate severe consequences for the violation of the public trust by said officials. The penalties are extremely severe, including censure, removal from office, permanent disqualification from holding any government position, restitution, pecuniary sanction, and imprisonment. Brennan also overlooks the fact that in many systems there is a strong professional ethos that augments these external sanctions. In stacking the deck in favor of his central conclusion, Brennan thus overlooks two central types of incentives for good official behavior, while also ignoring the fallibility and discoordinating effects of reliance on individual judgment.

Still, concerning Brennan’s assumptions about the behavior of government officials, he acknowledges that the actions of government officials should be accompanied by more epistemic uncertainty and moral caution than civilian actions. In practice, this means that if, for example, a person observes a police officer acting violently, the observer should start from the assumption that the officer is acting for a good reason and, consequently, be more cautious in deciding whether to act against the officer. Nonetheless, for Brennan the sufficient condition to act against the officer is that the civilian reasonably believes that the defensive action is necessary to prevent the officer from committing a supposed injustice, even though he admits that the officer might have a higher confidence level in her credence (i.e., know better than the civilian). But then shouldn’t this higher confidence level be enough to rationally justify the special immunity thesis?

Epistemically, the special immunity thesis relies indeed on the reasonable assumption that government official actions are warranted, unlike those of civilians. Halting a stranger, using force to stop a riot, and appropriating someone else’s property are all examples of actions that are perceived as unjust when undertaken by civilians but as just when undertaken by government officials. In fact, only the most egregious cases are likely to trigger the same belief in third party observers. But the most egregious cases arguably reduce to the domain of self-defense against government officials, which are typically self-corrected by the government itself through adequate provisions. On this account, the special immunity thesis has a clear statistical rational. Further, the epistemic argument in favor of the special immunity thesis also helps address coordination problems by establishing a hierarchy of beliefs. Consider the case where an officer A is exercising force against individual B. Civilian C believes that A’s action is unjust and decides to act against A. Civilian D, however, believes that it is C’s action that is unjust and then decides to act against C and in defense of A. In this scenario, it is easy to predict a tragic epilogue, unless some guiding principle exists for coordinating individual beliefs.

Moving to defensive lying, Brennan’s arguments in defense of what he sees as a primary strategy against government injustice are suggestive, but, again, fail to fully address equilibrium effects. Insights from the literature on cheap-talk games help clarify these effects. Cheap-talk games are games where a party (the “sender”) strategically transmits information to another party (the “receiver”), while the parties’ interests are misaligned. As applied to defensive lying, this theoretical framework revisits the reasons that motivate government officials, politicians, or judges to lie as being grounded in the belief that the receiver’s interest is not aligned with that of the sender.2 The result of cheap-talk exchanges of this kind is that rational parties will anticipate that information is transmitted strategically, with the result that no credible information will be transmitted at all (i.e., bubbling equilibrium). Thus, if citizens knew that lying was morally justifiable for politicians, they would stop believing in anything politicians say. While one may argue that citizen trust in politicians is at record low these days, the two situations remain substantially different. Even under the current generalized skepticism, citizens who don’t trust politicians believe those politicians to be morally bad. In contrast, in a system that admits defensive lying as legitimate, the perspective would be reversed, as politicians who lie would be perceived as morally good. This would risk transforming the political context into a cheap-talk arena, weakening democratic institutions and depriving transmitted information of any value.

The case of defensive lying as applied to the judiciary is perhaps even more striking. For Brennan, that a Justice might lie about a statutory construction to manipulate a Supreme Court outcome is not just morally permissible, but required whenever the outcome is supported by a substantive justice reason. Under this account, the law is a purely epiphenomenal construct that belongs to the superstructure of society, with no room for the rule of law principle. This principle includes a normative commitment to the “supremacy of the law” over the arbitrary exercise of power (“the rule of men”). It is then clear why the rule of law has an intrinsic normative value from a natural law perspective. Yet, while seemingly embracing this perspective, Brennan contradictorily negates the value of the rule of law.

As observed by Lon Fuller, the rule of law implies that a government is regulated by certain legal rules and procedures, such as publicity. In this sense, the rule of law is seen as a necessary condition for justice. Publicity, for example, implies that the Justices will sincerely debate hard cases and put out their (true) views about what the law is. Strategic lying is not contemplated in this picture as it would violate the rule of law and, with it, justice. This does not mean that all laws are just, but this is not the problem. Statistically, shall we expect a more just society if we abide by fair procedures, even if they might occasionally generate bad outcomes, or if we turn all civilians into unaccountable arbiters of justice? Brennan advocates turning ordinary citizens into arbiters of justice and releasing judges from their obligation to follow norms that constrain their own preferences as to which judicial outcomes are best. This amounts to abolishing the role of judge as it is ordinarily understood and making every citizen a judge, but a judge free to operate without the constraints of the rule of law.

To conclude, Brennan asks very provocative questions and makes the reader think hard. The underpinning conceptual framework, however, has some weaknesses. Addressing these elements would further our understanding of the legitimacy of defensive ethics and, perhaps, also help us figure out ways to strengthen modern democracies.


Aumann, R. (1974). “Subjectivity and Correlation in Randomized Strategies.” Journal of Mathematical Economics 1 (1): 67-96.

Buchanan, A. (2018). “Institutional Legitimacy,” Oxford Studies in Political Philosophy.

Christiano, T. (2004). “The Authority of Democracy.” The Journal of Political Philosophy 12 (3): 266-290.

Crawford V. P. and J. Sobel, (1982). “Strategic Information Transmission,” Econometrica 50 (6): 1431-1451.

Fallon, R.H. (1997) “‘The Rule of Law’ As a Concept in Constitutional Discourse,” Columbia Law Review 97:1-56.

Fuller, L. (1964). The Morality of Law, Yale University Press.

Huemer, M. (2013). The Problem of Political Authority. Palgrave McMillan.

Rawls, J. (1971). A Theory of Justice. 2nd. Ed. Harvard University Press.

Raz, J. (1986). The Morality of Freedom. Oxford University Press.

1 Technically, this probability distribution is called a correlated equilibrium if the strategy vector in which all players follow the observer’s recommendations is a Nash equilibrium of the extended game.

2 Brennan would say that the interests are aligned but the receiver is biased or might not understand how things really are (paternalistic argument). This argument, however, does not change the substance of strategic interaction.