When is True Belief Knowledge?

Placeholder book cover

Richard Foley, When is True Belief Knowledge?, Princeton University Press, 2012, 153pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691154725.

Reviewed by Clayton Littlejohn, King's College, London


The orthodox view is that true beliefs are sometimes knowledge. Since true belief doesn't distinguish knowledge from ignorance, something else must. Is it a person's being justified in believing a true proposition? No, not if Gettier is right. Is it causal-relatedness? Reliability? Sensitivity? Safety? Aptness? No, not if Foley is right. To turn a true belief into knowledge, Foley thinks we need more true belief. The mistake we made in the wake of Gettier was trying to find something to add to true belief that differs in kind. More of the same will do. On Foley's view, if you believe p without knowing p, you're either mistaken about p or there's some important truth that you're missing. If you're right about p and you have adequate information, you'll know p.

What does it take to have adequate information? Information is taken to be true belief. The adequacy of your information isn't understood in terms of quantity. Even if you have little information concerning p, it might be enough to know p. The adequacy of your information doesn't supervene upon facts about the true beliefs you have. Somebody could have the very same true beliefs that you do and not know something you do. Adequacy seems to be understood negatively. You have adequate information if there's nothing important that you're missing. If your belief about p is correct and there's no important truth that you're missing, you know that p. If there's some important truth that you're missing, you won't know that p.

What's an important truth? Foley doesn't think that there's some general characteristic that distinguishes the important truths from the rest. Just as the particularists seem to think that right acts share little in common apart from rightness, Foley seems to think that what important truths share in common is importance. He recommends an "ecumenical" approach. Sometimes an important truth might be a clue the subject is missing. Sometimes it might have to do with the reliability of processes or methods responsible for a subject's beliefs. Sometimes differences in practical stakes mean that truths that aren't important for you will be important to others. Foley is skeptical of the commonly held view that there's some general way of characterizing the defects and depravity that undermine knowledge. If there's no general account of important truths, how can Foley's approach shed light on the notion of knowledge? He thinks we have a knack for finding important truths. In any of the normal cases where a subject's true belief doesn't constitute knowledge, he thinks we'll find the important truth if we look for it.

It's not difficult to recommend Foley's bold new book. The approach he takes to the topic is completely novel. While it's not clear that his approach improves upon the extant approaches in the literature, it deserves careful consideration. In this review, I'll discuss features of his view that strike me as being the most problematic.

Is knowledge a mutt?

On Foley's approach, pedigree doesn't matter in the way that it does in more familiar accounts of knowledge. He doesn't think that reliability, for example, is a necessary condition for knowledge. He does acknowledge that it will often seem to us that a case of unreliably formed, true belief isn't a case of knowledge, but he thinks that the reason that the subject doesn't have knowledge is that the subject is missing an important truth. It's not unreliability, per se, that undermines the belief's epistemic standing.

To test this suggestion, he thinks we should consult our intuitions about cases involving subjects that have maximally comprehensive sets of accurate beliefs:

Imagine that Sally's beliefs are as accurate and comprehensive as it is humanly possible for them to be. She has true beliefs about the basic laws of the universe, and in terms of these she can explain what has happened, is happening, and will happen. She can explain the origin of the universe, the origin of the earth, the mechanisms by which cells age, and the year in which the sun will die. She even has a complete and accurate explanation of how it is that she came to have all this information. Consider a truth p-cells about the aging mechanism in cells. Sally believes p-cells, and because her beliefs about these mechanisms are maximally accurate and comprehensive, there are few gaps of any sort in her information, much less important ones. Thus, she knows p-cells (33).

It's consistent with the story that Sally doesn't meet the conditions on knowledge imposed by a reliabilist account of knowledge. Let's stipulate that the processes that produce Sally's beliefs are unreliable. We can suppose that it was a series of strange processes and unlikely events that led her to believe p-cells. Under these conditions, is Foley right that Sally knows?

I don't share Foley's intuition about the case. If we stipulate that Sally is trapped inside Nozick's experience machine, I don't think she knows p-cells. On this stipulation, I also fear that the case hasn't been described in suitably neutral terms. Suppose someone believes correctly that the barn burned down because a cow kicked over a lantern. Suppose, however, that she doesn't know that the barn burned down, doesn't know that a cow kicked over a lantern, and doesn't know that the barn burned down because a cow kicked over a lantern. (Because this subject has been stuffed into Nozick's experience machine, her beliefs are only accidentally correct.) Can she explain why the barn burned down? I don't think so. She can explain why barns burn, why cows topple lanterns, etc., but she cannot explain why events she didn't know about transpired. If Sally had the knowledge she'd need to be able to explain these things, I'd probably agree that she knows p-cells. I'm less inclined to do so if the case is carefully described as one in which most of her beliefs are only accidentally true.

Anticipating this response, Foley tries to motivate his description of the case by noting that "Sally is fully aware that however strange and unlikely this history may be, in her case it led to her having maximally accurate and comprehensive beliefs" (34). I still have reservations. First, I don't think he's entitled to describe the case as one in which Sally is 'aware' of these facts. Can you be aware that p if you don't know that p? He might argue that Sally is aware of the facts related to p-cells, but that's a controversial description that needs justification. Second, Sally's beliefs about her own strange and unlikely history are among the beliefs that aren't grounded by reliable processes. If we think those beliefs don't constitute knowledge, it's not clear that they'd help to turn her belief about p-cells into knowledge.


How does Foley's approach handle lottery propositions? Billy believes that his ticket, #345, lost after the drawing was held, but he won't know that it lost simply on the basis of his correct beliefs about the set up of the lottery and the probability of losing. Foley says that his ignorance is due to some important gap in his information. For example, he doesn't have this bit of information -- ticket #543 was the winner (72).

Is this approach preferable to approaches that impose a sensitivity or safety condition? That's not clear. If the paper announces that #543 is the winner Billy will learn by reading the paper that he lost. So far, everyone is on the same page. What if the paper didn't announce the winning number but simply announced that Billy's ticket lost? If he reads that, he should know he lost. If that's sufficient for knowledge, what important truth was Billy missing before he read the paper that he has now? The important piece of information he's missing can't be that his ticket lost. If information is true belief, he had that information already. Maybe the important truth he's missing is not a truth about what the paper says, but simply that the paper said it. This would be an odd way to account for the intuition that Billy can't know without checking the paper. You might think that that information only matters because it provides you with information (in some intuitive sense of 'provides information' that's more demanding than Foley's notion) about the winners and losers. A natural explanation as to why reading the paper matters is that your belief wouldn't be sensitive or safe if it wasn't based on what the paper says. While it's not clear that our intuitive verdicts about lotteries are at odds with Foley's view, it's also not clear whether his view has the explanatory resources to account for those intuitions in the straightforward ways that rivals accounts do.

Rationality and Knowledge

Foley doesn't think that knowledge requires rationality/justification. In this passage he explains the virtue of an approach that severs the connection between knowledge and rationality/justification:

It frees the theory of knowledge from the dilemma of either having to insist on an overly intellectual conception of knowledge, according to which one is able to provide an intellectual defense of whatever one knows, or straining to introduce a nontraditional notion of justified belief because the definition of knowledge is thought to require this (126).

If rationality and/or justification aren't understood in terms of their relation to knowledge, how should they be understood? Foley proposes that believing p is epistemically rational if it is epistemically rational for you to believe that believing p would acceptably satisfy the epistemic goal of now having accurate and comprehensive belief (148). Believing p is justified if it is epistemically rational to believe that your procedures with respect to p have been acceptable given your goals and your limitations (132). Epistemic rationality is, on Foley's view, the foundational concept in an account of practical rationality. Whether it would be rational to φ in sense X (e.g., moral, prudential, etc.) depends upon the rationality of believing that φ-ing would do an acceptably good job at satisfying your goals of type X (128).[1]

One area of concern has to do with pragmatic encroachment. At various places Foley expresses some sympathy for the view that knowledge can be harder to attain when the practical stakes are high. It's not clear what role, if any, practical significance plays in his account of epistemic rationality. That's because it's not at all clear what role the practical stakes can play in determining whether believing p would satisfy your twin epistemic goals. Provided that p isn't itself about some practical subject matter, it seems that the account would exclude practical considerations. Would an account that combines a purist account of epistemic rationality with an impurist account of knowledge be stable? The account might not be incoherent. Would it accommodate our intuitions? That's hard to say. The intuitive motivation for accepting pragmatic encroachment has partially to do with intuitions about when it's rational to proceed on the information you have and when it would be rational to search for additional evidence before making a decision.[2] Because of this, it's hard to see how to square the standard intuitions offered in support of pragmatic encroachment for knowledge with a seemingly purist account of rational belief if Foley is right and the rational thing to do is determined by rational beliefs about what would do an acceptable job of meeting your goals.

A second area of potential concern has to do with the seriousness of the dilemma Foley wishes to avoid. There are many plausible accounts of rational/justified belief that would preserve the link between knowledge and justification but don't lead to an overly intellectual conception of either knowledge or justification. (It's not clear, for example, why Foley's own theory of rational belief doesn't solve this dilemma since it's not clear whether there are cases of knowing p where it's not rational to believe that your belief concerning p would do an acceptably good job of meeting your own epistemic goals.) Moreover, we do have some independent reason to think that knowledge and justification go together. Suppose you know (p or q) and that you justifiably believe ~p without knowing ~p. You infer q. It seems that there must be something going for believing q because you've deduced q from a set of premises justifiably believed or known. We can't assume that q is known because it's not deduced from a set of known premises (and it's consistent with what's been said that q is false). To accommodate the intuition that there's something good about believing q, we either need to say that the belief is rational/justified or introduce some wholly new term of epistemic approval. I can't see any good reason to coin a new term here to pick out beliefs that are good in some way because deduced from premises justifiably believed or known that are not themselves justified or known, so I'd prefer to describe the belief as rational or as justified. This seems to require that there's a link between knowledge and rationality/justification. Assuming that there is a connection between knowledge and justification helps us make sense of what's happening in cases with this structure.[3]

A third potential concern has to do with Foley's conception of rational action. If knowing doesn't require rationally believing, I suppose that it's possible that somebody could know that she has all the reason in the world to φ without rationally believing that she has all the reason in the world to φ. Suppose Sally is like that and suppose she doesn't φ. Billy thinks we should blame her. Billy thinks she was being unreasonable. Is the fact that Sally knew that she had all the reason in the world to φ exculpatory? It doesn't seem so. It seems quite odd to say that Sally was perfectly reasonable having conceded that she knew she had all the reason in the world to φ and chose not to. It seems that Foley would have to say that Billy was mistaken. For while she knew that she had all the reason in the world to φ, it wasn't unreasonable for her to refrain because her belief didn't meet the requirements of Foley's conception of rationality.

Let me mention one final concern. One of the costs of severing the connection between rationality and knowledge is that it's difficult to explain why certain combinations of belief and concessions about what you're not in a position to know strike us as being irrational. If we know that knowing has nothing at all to do with rationality and rationality has nothing at all to do with knowledge, it will be difficult to explain why is it irrational to believe outright, say, that dogs bark while conceding that you don't know whether they do. Given Foley's account of rationality, it would be easy to explain this if we assumed that knowledge is the aim or the standard of correctness for belief.

Ignorance as a lack

Foley thinks that there's nothing at all puzzling about believing what you concede you don't know. He's right, I think, that reports of the form 'I believe p, but I don't know it' are common (101). While the remark seems perfectly natural, the naturalness of the remark shouldn't be taken to show that there's nothing puzzling about believing p while conceding you don't know. We often say 'I believe p' as a way of hedging. It's a way of expressing that we don't commit ourselves to the truth of p in the way that 'true believers' do. What about cases of full belief? If you believe that dogs bark, can you reasonably concede that you don't know while retaining that belief?

The combination of beliefs expressed by, 'Dogs bark, but I don't know that they do' strikes many of us as irrational. We've seen already that Foley will have a hard time explaining this. It also seems that the speaker cannot know that the proposition expressed is true. It's interesting to note that Foley's account provides a nice explanation as to why this is. To know that dogs bark, there would have to be no important truths that you were missing. The second conjunct is true iff you don't know that dogs bark. Assuming you believe correctly that dogs bark, the second conjunct couldn't be true unless there's some important truth that you were missing. Foley's account explains why you can't know both conjuncts.

While Foley's account nicely handles the first case, I don't think it can easily handle beliefs expressed by statements of the form, 'p, but my evidence doesn't show/establish that p'. It doesn't seem that you can know that the proposition this expresses is true. Can Foley explain why this is? The proposition expressed isn't necessarily false. If someone believed this without knowing that it's true, Foley's account implies that there's some important truth that the subject is missing. I can't think of what that truth might be.

To explain why the proposition expressed by 'p, but my evidence doesn't show/establish that p' isn't knowable, someone might say this:

To know the conjunction, you'd have to know both conjuncts. To know p, you'd have to have evidence that establishes p. If you have that evidence, the second conjunct is false and the conjunction is not known. If you lack that evidence, you don't know the first conjunct and the conjunction is not known. The conjunction is not knowable.

This explanation isn't available to Foley. He wouldn't want to say that knowing p requires having evidence that establishes p.[4]

He might instead offer this explanation:

To know the conjunction, you'd have to know both conjuncts. To know p, you can't be irrational in believing p. Believing the second conjunct makes believing the first conjunct irrational. You can't know the conjunction without believing the second conjunct. The conjunction is not knowable.

If he offers this explanation, he doesn't have to appeal to the idea that knowing p requires having evidence that shows that p. He can say instead that not believing that one lacks this evidence is necessary for knowing.

While this second line of explanation is better suited to Foley's purposes, it faces a number of problems. First, the explanation assumes that your ignorance is due to a presence, not an absence. It's not due to the fact that you're missing some truth, but due to the presence of a set of attitudes that's rationally self-defeating. Second, this explanation is shallow. If it didn't matter whether you had evidence that showed that p, why would it matter what view you had on whether you had this evidence? Some explanation of the irrationality of believing p whilst believing that your evidence doesn't show p is in order. Does it fall out of Foley's account of rationality? It's not obvious that it does. Third, it's not clear that Foley's account of rationality will help him explain the relevant data if it's part of his account of knowledge that knowledge doesn't require rationality.

How serious is this problem? Foley's view seems to be that ignorance is due to a lack. The cases discussed here suggest that the gap isn't always due to some lack of information. Some truths might be unknowable because believing them would be irrational. If irrationality precludes knowledge, you can add all the true beliefs you like and you'll not restore the rationality needed for knowledge.

Knowledge Blocks

Foley acknowledges that a pure version of his view might be difficult to defend. Conceding that his account won't accommodate all of our intuitions, he suggests that a perfectly good fallback position would be one that acknowledges 'knowledge blocks'. Think of a knowledge block as something that interferes with the normal conditions for knowledge, say, by preventing the subject from meeting some minimum standard of rationality, reliability, tethering of belief to experience, etc. On the modified version of the view, knowledge is true belief with adequate information without any knowledge blocks.

To accommodate commonly held intuitions, Foley would need to introduce knowledge blocks. By doing so, it seems he would have to impose general rationality and reliability requirements on knowledge. Can he do this while maintaining the distinctiveness of his approach? That remains to be seen. The notion of an important truth might play an important role in the theory of knowledge even if it doesn't render otiose other notions having to do with rationality or non-accidental connections.


Adler, J. 2002. Belief's Own Ethics. MIT University Press.

Fantl, J. and M. McGrath. 2002. Evidence, Pragmatics, and Justification. Philosophical Review 111: 67-94.

Williamson, T. 2007. On Being Justified in One's Head. In M. Timmons, J. Greco, and A. Mele (ed.), Rationality and the Good: Critical Essays on the Ethics and Epistemology of Robert Audi (Oxford University Press).


[1] As stated, the account is sketchy. There are two points that could use further discussion. First, Foley provides an account of goal-relative practical rationality, but no account of overall practical rationality. Given the goal of meeting your moral obligations, it would be practically rational in the moral sense to φ if it is rational to believe that φ-ing would do acceptably well at meeting that goal. Given the goal of looking after your own interests, it would be practically irrational in the prudential sense to φ if it is rational to believe φ-ing would prevent you from meeting that goal. What about all-things-considered practical rationality? Is that notion confused? Can we provide an account of that notion in terms of, say, some overarching goal? Foley doesn't say. Second, he says nothing about the coherence or intelligibility of the goals. Can't there be goals that are unintelligible or incoherent? Are there practically rational ways to go about trying to count the moon?

[2] See Fantl and McGrath (2002) for discussion.

[3] See Williamson (2007) for discussion of this sort of argument.

[4] Adler (2002) argues that reflection on Moore's paradox reveals that this requirement must be met to know and to satisfy the normative standards governing belief.