When the State Speaks, What Should It Say?: How Democracies Can Protect Expression and Promote Equality

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Corey Brettschneider, When the State Speaks, What Should It Say?: How Democracies Can Protect Expression and Promote Equality, Princeton University Press, 2012, 232pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691147628.

Reviewed by Virginia Held, City University of New York, Graduate School


Almost daily, we hear of religious offense or ethnic hatred or racial animus exploding, or being on the verge of exploding, into violence. The curbing of "hate speech," a practice already in place in much of Europe, seems a policy that should be considered. Corey Brettschneider adopts, instead, the general approach advocated by John Stuart Mill that misguided speech ought to be answered by more and better speech, not suppressed. He makes a strong case, and goes on to argue that the state should be a vigorous participant in providing that better speech. The state ought actively to promote awareness of the reasons for rights to free speech, and it ought to speak loudly in favor of the values of free and equal citizenship. It ought thus to counter hate speech with lessons in why discrimination against racial minorities or women or gays is wrong.

In contrast with Jeremy Waldron who has recently argued that hate speech does not deserve the protection of rights to free speech, Brettschneider thinks that hate groups ought to continue to be able to state their views and sign up members, but the state should clearly answer them. It is not enough, in his view, to see such noxious views as private and protected. In contrast with views that the state should be neutral in such cases, as one might think would be implied by John Rawls's position that the state ought to be neutral about issues belonging to comprehensive morality, Brettschneider argues that the state ought not be neutral about democratic values. It ought, on the contrary, to speak persuasively for the values of freedom and equality. And as part of its commitment to respecting the freedom of each citizen, and avoiding becoming the "Invasive State," the state ought to rely on persuasion, not the coercion of those who speak hate. Brettschneider rejects the more expansive view that the state should promote a comprehensive vision of liberal virtues. It should, he thinks, limit its message to the promotion of the political ideal of free and equal citizenship. For him, this is enough to counter the "Hateful Society" that might result from complete state neutrality in the face of vigorous hate speech with which the liberal state might appear complicit.

Calling his theory "value democracy," Brettschneider writes: "By focusing on the simultaneous role of the state in protecting rights and criticizing discriminatory messages, I hope to clarify how we might avoid the excesses of both the Hateful Society and the Invasive State" (71). He presents what he sees as "a conception of publicly justifiable privacy, which regards practices and beliefs in civil society as publicly relevant when they conflict with the values of free and equal citizenship" (28).

The latter requires that "all citizens have equal status under law" (31); views that "relegate women, minorities, or other groups to second-class citizenship directly challenge this ideal" (ibid). In addition to its powers to coerce, the state has "expressive capacities." The state, Brettschneider argues, ought to "express a message that promotes the values of free and equal citizenship" (47).

Brettschneider examines a substantial number of Supreme Court decisions concerning freedom of expression, agreeing with many and arguing against some. He sees in Bob Jones University v. United States a good example of a decision illustrating the way the state can express its commitment to valuing all citizens as free and equal. Bob Jones University, an evangelical Christian institution in South Carolina, enforced various racially discriminatory policies including a ban on interracial dating. The IRS withdrew its tax-exempt status, and the decision was upheld by the Supreme Court in 1983. Brettschneider argues that "the state should use its spending power to defend democratic values", and that "the extension of non-profit status with its tax privileges should be regarded as a type of subsidy" (128). The Court, in upholding the decision, supported the view that organizations that oppose the values of free and equal citizenship do not meet the requirement that they provide a "public benefit" if they are to receive the subsidy. Such groups are not denied their rights to free expression and association, in Brettschneider's view, since they are not coercively interfered with. But in refusing to subsidize them, the state uses its expressive capacity to try to persuade such groups that they should change discriminatory policies, and in the case of Bob Jones University, 17 years after the Supreme Court ruling, the university issued a statement of regret for having "allowed institutional policies to remain in place that were racially hurtful" (163), and changed those policies.

To Brettschneider, the Supreme Court's doctrine of viewpoint neutrality "is appropriate as a standard for limiting state coercion . . . all viewpoints, regardless of their content, should be protected by freedom of expression" (22). However, he argues, this standard

is misplaced as a guide to determining the state's own expression and what it should say . . . The state should be non-neutral in its persuasive and expressive roles. It should pursue a robust, non-neutral policy of persuading citizens to change their discriminatory views and to respect the ideal of free and equal citizenship (22-23).

At a theoretical level, I find Brettschneider's argument important and relatively persuasive. But there are problems. Where the book is most disappointing is in its paucity of consideration of how the state can and should promote the "value democracy" he espouses. How should the state effectively express the values of free and equal citizenship? Perhaps it could not do so without going beyond the narrow scope of Brettschneider's interpretation of equality.

Brettschneider writes that "the state can celebrate Martin Luther King Day and build public monuments to honor the civil rights movement" (45, 95). The Supreme Court can explain the reasons for its decisions, though admittedly such opinions "are not widely read" (45). Politicians and office holders can speak out. Public education can require that students be taught the values of free and equal citizenship. And the state can withhold tax exemption or subsidies from groups that argue against the equal treatment of all citizens.

Brettschneider treats it as unproblematic that teachers should be required to promote the values of free and equal citizenship, and that this implies they teach the history of the civil rights movement in a favorable way. There may well be more serious problems than he acknowledges in how the state should require history, or anything else, to be taught.

Another problem is his undue reliance on the distinction between interference, which he regards as coercive, and denial of benefit, which he regards as non-coercive. He relies on a definition of coercion that many will dispute, as they recognize the realities of coercive offers (Pennock and Chapman). For instance, if a state would control large sectors of employment and deny its opponents employment in those sectors, it would be acting coercively. Only if  you are already in a satisfactory condition will the state's threat of making you worse off be regarded as coercive while an offer to supply what you need be judged non-coercive.

More serious weaknesses in Brettschneider's treatment are his limited view of equality and his very limited attention to how the state should express itself. What makes the U.S. more plutocratic and less democratic today is the ability of those with economic power to wield it to influence legislation, elections, public opinion and civil society. Having the state erect a monument, or a teacher profess our equality as citizens, is hardly an adequate challenge to the political might of the economically powerful. Brettschneider also says nothing about the media and their influence. He assumes that "the state is much more powerful than individuals, even when it employs its expressive rather than its coercive capacity" (47). But why agree that the state's message of political equality will be more successful than the messages of the corporate culture? After decades of the demonizing of government by one major political party and its tepid defense by the other, why should we suppose that the corporate culture's celebration of wealth, markets for everything, and the winning of competitions, will be seriously challenged by a few pious declarations favoring equality, or by a monument?

It makes little sense to suppose that all citizens are being valued as free and equal citizens when some lack, and cannot through their own efforts obtain, the means to act effectively as citizens while others wallow in excess. Yet Brettschneider's treatment of the issues says almost nothing about economic inequality and nothing about the culture's overwhelming promotion of it. He speaks on one occasion of a "minimal requirement of access to resources" (112), but there is exactly one mention of the need for a "just distribution of wealth" (113) and nothing more is said about it. Nor is there consideration of what is needed in contemporary society to "have a voice" (Held 1988). Should the state, for instance, give away fewer of the public's airwaves for commercial exploitation? Should it adequately tax the profits of media companies, as is done in some other countries, to provide serious levels of support for non-commercial public media, so that the latter are not constantly threatened with the withdrawal of whatever puny governmental support they now receive? Should the state have its own voice in the media and what form should this take? What should the state do to have a voice that would actually be heard amid the din of the corporate media? And how do the new media of the internet affect, or not affect, the cacophony?

Brettschneider focuses on the problem of discrimination against minorities and women. He neglects the issue of economic justice and how the state should recognize and effectively promote a commitment to it. Economic justice is clearly a serious problem for democracy in the U.S. and for valuing citizens as free and equal. It is also a major problem for thinking about rights to free speech, and about access to a voice in the "public square," however that is reconceptualized.

Of course the interpretation of economic justice, and what (in economic terms) respect for all citizens as free and equal would require, is controversial. But what equal respect requires with regard to racial and gender discrimination was once, and on various issues still is, controversial. One might look to books such as Brettschneider's for recommendations about what the state ought to decide about equal citizenship and free expression with respect to issues that the dominant culture does not yet agree on, especially when the expression that it does foster works so successfully to obscure the issues.


Held, Virginia, "Access, Enablement, and the First Amendment," in Philosophical Dimensions of the Constitution, edited by Diana T. Meyers and Kenneth Kipnis. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1988.

Pennock, Roland and John Chapman (eds.), Coercion (NOMOS XIV) NY: Aldine-Atherton, 1972.