Whitehead's Radically Different Postmodern Philosophy: An Argument for Its Contemporary Relevance

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David Ray Griffin, Whitehead's Radically Different Postmodern Philosophy: An Argument for Its Contemporary Relevance, State University of New York Press, 2007, 303pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780791470497.

Reviewed by Joseph A. Bracken, S.J., Xavier University


For many years, David Ray Griffin has been a prolific exponent of the value and significance of the metaphysical scheme of Alfred North Whitehead­ (albeit with some modifications by Whitehead's early disciple, Charles Hartshorne) for the purposes of a contemporary world view.  In this book, he frames his argument in terms of postmodernism's challenge to the rationalist presuppositions of the Enlightenment: e.g., epistemological foundationalism and metaphysical dualisms of matter/ spirit and fact/ value.  But, while conceding the legiti­macy of these critiques of modernity, he also argues that many postmodernists have effectively denied all claims to truth and objectivity in human discourse.  Hence, Whitehead's metaphysics is the only true postmodernism in that it restores truth and objectivity within the context of a new metaphysics based on intersubjectivity or "panexperientialism".  Thereby Whitehead completes the "turn to the subject" inaugurated by Descartes and exposes the inevitable limitations of the post­modern "turn to language" as the starting-point for philosophical reflection.

The book is divided into three parts, with Part One serving as explanation for applying the term postmodernism to Whitehead's philosophy.  As indicated above, Whitehead's philosophy represents a middle ground between the excessive rationalism of the Enlightenment and the latent anti-rationalism of many contemporary postmodernists.  In addition, with his notion of "causal efficacy" as a major factor in sense cog­nition, Whitehead both critiqued the phenomenalism of Immanuel Kant and reaffirmed the ontological reality of the self (contra David Hume), albeit as a patterned succession of moments of experience rather than as an enduring immaterial substance.  At the same time, he endorsed epistemic naturalism (reliance on reason and experience rather than authority or tradition) and, properly understood, ontological naturalism (panentheism rather than classical theism).

In Part Two, Griffin takes up in successive chapters Whitehead's position on consciousness, ecology, truth, time and ethics.  Once again, he portrays Whitehead as occupying a middle ground between classical philosophy/theology and various modern and post­modern proposals.  Mind or soul, for example, is not a function of the brain but the regnant subsociety of actual occasions (moments of experi­ence) within the multi-structured society constituting a human being.  Thus it is not different in kind from the subsocie­ties of actual occasions proper to the body.  Consciousness, accord­ingly, is not a function of the soul as a strictly immaterial reality but the "subjective form" or mode of existence of certain higher-level actual occasions within the human person.  In the area of ecology, Griffin notes how Whitehead, contrary to the tenets of contemporary "deep ecology," affirms the greater intrinsic value of human beings over other life-forms but still insists that every actual occasion, even those constituting inanimate things, has some intrinsic value as an instance of "creativity" or self-organization and -enjoyment.  Hence, where deep ecologists might be tempted to subordinate the individual entity to the survival needs of the environment, Whitehead's thinking demands a balance between pre­serving an environment and the intrinsic value of the individual entities involved.

Whitehead's understanding of truth is grounded in the classical notion of truth as correspondence to reality rather than simply in logical coherence or with an eye to pragmatic consequences.  Here he introduces the notion of "hard-core common sense beliefs" which cannot be denied without implicit contradiction in the practical order: e.g., claiming that truth statements are always relative.  At the same time, the acquisition of know­ledge is invariably dialogical since there is no "universally valid, framework-transcendent criteria in terms of which to adjudi­cate differences of opinion" (98).  Likewise, Whitehead stands in opposition both to the "block-universe" understanding of time as a fourth spatial dimension and to the classical understanding of God as existing outside of time.  Rather, for Whitehead and Griffin, God is just as much a part of the temporal order as any creature.  Hence, even God does not know with certitude what will happen in the future of the cosmic process since these events cannot be known with certainty even by God until they actually happen.  The last chapter in Part Two deals with the necessary grounding of morality in religious conviction without the risk of heteronomy, the surrender of human reason to an alleged divine will.  For, a purely naturalistic approach to ethics cannot provide "a credible defense of moral objectivity, meaning that some basic moral prin­ciples … constitute genuine human knowledge" (141).  What ought to be is distinct from what here and now happens to be the case.  Nor does a naturalistic ethics provide sufficient motivation to lead a moral life under duress.  Hence, moral precepts must be grounded in a transcendent source of meaning and value, namely, God as the Eros of the Universe, "the active entertainment of all ideals, with the urge to their finite realization, each in its due season" (161).

Part Three of Griffin's book and an Appendix are dedicated to a defense of the coherence of Whitehead's scheme against challen­ges from relativity theory, from another process-oriented thinker (Robert Neville), and from Whitehead's own somewhat confusing explanation of the "subjectivist principle" or panexperientialism in Process and Reality.  The alleged conflict with relativity theory arises from the fact that in Whitehead's cosmology there is a "cosmic now" governing all contemporary events in the cosmic process.  What is future for us human beings is likewise future for God.  Griffin's response is that relativity theory has to do with physical causation rather than with instantaneous communication between actual occasions in terms of their mental poles ("hybrid physical causation").  The problem could also have been alleviated, of course, if Griffin had allowed for a trinitarian understanding of panentheism, whereby the space-time continuum of this world would be contained within eternity as the entirely different duration proper to the three divine persons: "with the Lord one day is like a thousand years and a thousand years like one day" (2 Peter 3/8).

With reference to Neville's assertion that process theism is "incoherent, superfluous, and descriptive of an alleged reality that would not be worthy of worship even if it existed" (186), Griffin's response is that in fact Neville's own understanding of the God-world relationship better answers to that same description.  To be fair, Neville's approach to the God-world relationship is more voluntar­istic, emphasizing that everything determinate (including the reality of God as Creator) is derivative from an indeterminate and necessarily unknown ground of being, whereas Griffin's (and Harts­horne's) approach is more rationalistic, emphasizing the necessity of metaphysical first principles which even God cannot alter.  But are they then contradictory or complementary to one another as different models of the God-world relationship?  Finally, in the appendix Griffin offers a detailed expla­nation of the terms "subjectivist principle" and "subjectivist bias" in Process and Reality.  The distinction is important because it undergirds the hypothesis of panexperientialism, namely, that "the final real things of which the world is made up" (PR [1968], 17) are actual occasions or momentary subjects of experience.  Likewise, it makes clear how we human beings experience the world through our bodies as themselves societies of lower-grade actual occasions.  Thus we "feel" the world as linked with ourselves before we picture it objectively as "out there" or separate from ourselves.  Human sense experience is, accordingly, a major simplification of all that is happening both within us and around us at every moment, as twentieth-century natural science has also made clear from an entirely different perspec­tive.

Since I too am convinced that Whitehead's metaphysical scheme represents a major new initiative in the history of Western philosophy, my criticisms of Griffin's presentation of his thought are inevitably rather modest.  Yet they are serious enough to merit consideration here.  For example, I question whether Whitehead's thought should be described as a radically different form of postmodernism.  I myself would prefer to describe it, albeit with some qualifications, as an appropriate return to a premodern understanding of reality wherein metaphysics and a genuinely cosmological approach to reality once again are the focus of attention.  In other words, Descartes' turn to the subject with its strong focus on an anthropocentric approach to reality was perhaps necessary to break free of the logical abstractions of late medieval metaphysics.  But the same turn to the subject has produced in the twentieth century widespread scepticism about the possibility of objective human knowledge and universal moral values.  As Martin Heidegger noted in Being and Time, we need to take up again the question of being: what it means to be both as a responsible human being and in terms of a deeper understanding of the laws of Nature as discovered by the natural and social sciences.  We need a new world view which respects the evolutionary character of reality and yet insists upon enduring structures of reality which are not simply the result of chance and natural selection, that is, ongoing adjustment to an ever-changing physical environment.

Still another point on which Griffin and I differ is in his reliance on reason and common human experience to the exclusion of divine revel­ation or any form of "supernaturalism" in the working out of a philosophical system.  For Griffin, this is an important legacy of the Enlightenment that must be preserved at all costs.  For me, the historical record of the Enlightenment has only proven that, when one gives up trying to resolve the initial tension between faith and reason in the fashioning of a world view, a generically conceived theism rapidly becomes a form of deism which then in many cases leads to practical atheism.  This is not to claim that divine revelation necessarily trumps human reason whenever logical opposition arises, but only that we human beings must be prepared to revise our previous understanding of both divine revelation and human reason to bring them better into consonance with one another as time goes on.

This is why in my own rethinking of Whitehead's metaphysics I presumed from the start that his metaphysical categories needed revision in order to accom­modate Christian belief in God as Trinity.  With this in mind, I soon realized that Whitehead's key category of "society" needed further development.  A "society," after all, must be more than an aggregate of actual occasions with a "common element of form" (PR [1968], 34) if philosophical atomism is to be avoided.  My own solution was to reinterpret a Whiteheadian society as an enduring structured field of activity for successive generations of constituent actual occasions.  Thus understood, a Whiteheadian "society" serves both to legitimate a trinitarian process-oriented understanding of God and to make Whitehead's philosophy an even stronger social ontology than he himself envisioned.  That is, "the final real things of which the world is made up" are not simply actual occasions but the societies into which they spontaneously aggregate.  ­By limiting his notion of "creativity" to the self-con­stitution of actual occasions and not also extending it to the formation of "societies," Whitehead, as I see it, only partially solved the vexing problem of contemporary pluralism, namely, how to achieve a dynamic unity ­among radically diverse parts or members at all the different levels of existence and activity in this world.  To sum up, faith and reason can not only be brought into harmony, as Griffin himself presupposes in this book, but can further illuminate and even transform one another, if one is willing to work hard at their reconciliation.