Who Knew? Responsibility Without Awareness

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George Sher, Who Knew? Responsibility Without Awareness, Oxford UP, 2009, 157pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195389203.

Reviewed by Neal A. Tognazzini, The College of William & Mary



With a few notable exceptions, most who write on moral responsibility acknowledge that it has an epistemic dimension — in a paragraph, if they are given to wordiness — before quickly pressing on to sexier questions about control and free will. As a result, any alleged vindication of our practices of holding one another responsible must always be qualified, sotto voce: ‘given that the agent satisfies the epistemic condition on moral responsibility, too’. If the reason for such neglect is the thought that the epistemic condition will be neither difficult to specify nor controversial in its details, then George Sher’s new book issues a forceful injunction: think again.

In enviably lucid prose, Sher offers an indictment of our unreflective inclinations to center the epistemic condition exclusively on conscious awareness. He argues that the best version of such a condition will instead be disjunctive, allowing for the possibility of responsibility even in cases of ignorant wrongdoing, so long as the ignorance involved stems from the agent himself in the right way. The final epistemic condition in all its glory looks like this (‘FEC’ for ‘full epistemic condition’):

FEC: When someone performs an act in a way that satisfies the voluntariness condition, and when he also satisfies any other conditions for responsibility that are independent of the epistemic condition, he is responsible for his act’s morally or prudentially relevant feature if, but only if, he either

(1) is consciously aware that the act has that feature (i.e., is wrong or foolish or right or prudent) when he performs it; or else

(2) is unaware that the act is wrong or foolish despite having evidence for its wrongness or foolishness his failure to recognize which

(a) falls below some applicable standard, and

(b) is caused by the interaction of some combination of his constitutive attitudes, dispositions, and traits; or else

(3) is unaware that the act is right or prudent despite having made enough cognitive contact with the evidence for its rightness or prudence to enable him to perform the act on that basis. (p. 143)

Sher admits that FEC is “complicated and unlovely”, but each gauche complication is well motivated, the result of thorough argumentation earlier in the book (p. 144).

Chapters 1 and 2, respectively, set out and roundly criticize a naïve but apparently popular epistemic condition — Sidgwick, Sartre, Barbara Herman, and Michael Zimmerman are all proponents, it seems — that Sher calls ‘The Searchlight View’: roughly, that “an agent’s responsibility extends only as far as his awareness of what he is doing” (p. 4). Sher devises nine imaginative (but by no means incredible) scenarios to argue that The Searchlight View has the intuitively unacceptable consequence that forgetfulness, poor judgment, and lack of moral insight let wrongdoers off the hook. Consider, for example, Home for the Holidays (p. 26): upon hearing noises downstairs, a panicked Joliet accidentally shoots her own son, thinking that he is a burglar. Since she was unaware both that her son was the source of the suspicious noises and that she was acting wrongly in not investigating the matter further, The Searchlight View entails that Joliet is not responsible for wounding him. This is clearly the wrong result.

Rather than using intuitive judgments as coffin nails, however, Sher sensibly recognizes that his various scenarios merely support a conditional: if The Searchlight View is true, then many of our intuitive judgments are way off base. But should we go with modus ponens or modus tollens? In chapters 3 and 4, Sher considers and rejects two prominent reasons for thinking that modus ponens is in order. According to the first (taken up in chapter 3), The Searchlight View is implicated by the practical origins of the concept of responsibility. Roughly, the thought is that the essentially practical nature of responsibility (à la Korsgaard and Bok), in combination with the fact that the practical point of view coincides with the agent’s conscious awareness, naturally gives rise to The Searchlight View. According to the second (taken up in chapter 4), The Searchlight View is supported by the idea that it is unfair to hold someone responsible for whatever is beyond his control. Since conscious awareness suggests itself as a necessary component of control, fairness requires that our practices of responsibility be constrained by The Searchlight View.

The downfall of these attempts to support The Searchlight View, according to Sher, is their conflation of “the engaged perspective that we occupy when we ourselves act” and “the detached perspective that we occupy when we consider other people’s acts … from the outside” (p. 9). To be sure, conscious awareness is all one has from the first-person perspective, but Sher argues persuasively that there’s no reason members of the broader moral community must restrict their vision in this way when attributing responsibility. Once the blinders are off, we can see the morally relevant aspects of Joliet’s situation that she should have seen, and these facts are precisely what render her responsible for shooting her son.

Of course, if you are like me, you have been thinking this whole time that any version of the epistemic condition without a disjunct specifying standards of awareness is evidently mistaken. What this means for you is that the book could easily have begun at chapter 5, where Sher begins to explore what needs to be included beyond mere conscious awareness. Still, since this is a book-length discussion of the epistemic condition (the first such, in fact), its comprehensiveness is a virtue.

In chapter 5, Sher considers a natural modification to The Searchlight View according to which responsibility requires either that the agent was consciously aware of what she was doing or at least that she should have been so aware (p. 72). Rather than solving the puzzle of how we can legitimately hold ignorant wrongdoers responsible, though, this modification merely exacerbates the problem. The agent has already violated one set of norms by acting wrongly, and all the additional disjunct points out is that there is yet another set of norms that the agent unwittingly violated by not realizing that she was acting wrongly. But the very issue is how obliviousness to the normative facts can be consistent with responsibility; adding yet more oblivion seems at best unhelpful.

What is needed, Sher insists, is some way of connecting the agent with her wrongdoing so that despite the agent’s ignorance, the wrongdoing is nevertheless her own. In chapter 6, Sher takes a page from his previous book, in which he argued that what makes for blameworthy action is the connection between the wrongdoing and “the interaction of a complex subset of the desires, beliefs, and fine-grained dispositions that together make their possessor the person he is” (In Praise of Blame, OUP, 2006, p. 49). Applied to the epistemic context, we get the result that ignorant wrongdoing can nevertheless be attributed to the agent so long as it is accounted for by the agent’s own “constitutive attitudes, dispositions, and traits” (p. 87). Since Joliet’s tendency to panic can plausibly account for her trigger-happiness, and since that tendency arguably falls within the complex psychological mélange that constitutes her identity as an agent, she is responsible for shooting her son, her ignorance notwithstanding (p. 92).

At this point in the book we have arrived at the first two disjuncts of FEC above: either the agent must have been consciously aware of his action’s normative significance or else the agent’s ignorance of his action’s wrongness must have been both subpar and accounted for by his constitutive attitudes, dispositions, and traits. Four tasks remain, one each for chapters 7 and 8, and two for chapter 9. First, Sher must give content to the relevant standards of awareness that render the ignorant wrongdoing subpar. Second, in light of Sher’s appeal to the agent’s constitutive psychological makeup, we need to see how to carve such attitudes, dispositions, and traits out of the broader range of attributes that constitute the human animal. And finally, Sher considers the implications his view has both for praise and for the alleged connection between responsibility and control.

In what sense, then, should the ignorant wrongdoer have been aware of what she was doing? Is it just that most people in her circumstances would have been aware, or are the relevant standards more robustly normative? Taking his cue from the insight that moral demands “address us precisely in our capacity as reason-responders”, Sher argues in chapter 7 that the relevant standards arise from the interaction of our cognitive capacities with the moral obligations that apply to us in the context (p. 115). What Joliet should have recognized are those considerations that she could have recognized (in a sense to be spelled out by considering various counterfactuals and operative physical mechanisms) and whose recognition was a precondition for fulfilling her pertinent moral duties (p. 111). This explication of the “norms of recognition”, as Sher calls them, rightly narrows their scope to exclude both those considerations beyond the reach of the agent’s capacities and those that were within the reach of the agent’s capacities but irrelevant to the matter at hand.

Chapter 8 provides a sketch of those elements of the human animal that are, and those that are not, properly located within the bounds of responsible agency. As we have seen, the success of FEC relies on a picture of the self according to which certain attitudes, dispositions, and traits that give rise to ignorant yet responsible wrongdoing count as constitutive in the relevant sense. If Joliet’s tendency to panic lies outside the bounds of her self, then FEC won’t be able to handle her case, after all. Similarly, if the bounds of Joliet’s self include all physical processes happening within her body, then FEC may well entail that she is responsible for far more than we originally would have thought. Sher ably navigates this sticky terrain to arrive at an intermediate conception of the responsible self that identifies an agent with “the collection of physical and psychological states whose elements interact to sustain his characteristic patterns of conscious and rational activity” (p. 124). The final picture, while theoretically sound, is a bit anticlimactic in part because it differs little (as Sher admits) from other familiar views like that of John Martin Fischer and Mark Ravizza.

Finally, in chapter 9, Sher ties up two loose ends: if the argument of his book succeeds, then how do we deal with praise and control? With respect to the former, he tacks on the third disjunct of FEC to allow for justifiable admiration of ignorant rightdoer Huckleberry Finn, who unwittingly treats Jim with due respect. On the subject of control, Sher points out that his arguments against The Searchlight View double as arguments against understanding the voluntariness required for responsibility in terms of conscious choice, a conception that is widely rejected in the contemporary literature in any case.

We are left with an impressively detailed portrait of the life of a responsible agent: begin with a conscious reasons-responder and the causes that sustain those attributes, and watch what happens. Of the good, bad, foolish, and prudent things he will undoubtedly do, some will be done knowingly and others unknowingly. Of the latter, some will meet the relevant moral and prudential standards and others won’t. Of the first, some will have been done out of respect for those standards despite his being unaware of them. Of the second, some will be the result of the very processes that make him the conscious reasons-responder he is. This relatively simple but powerful map, according to Sher, is our blueprint to the epistemic credentials needed for responsibility.

I have relatively few reservations about Sher’s overall argument, but one is perhaps worth mentioning. Although I am no proponent of The Searchlight View, I worry that the intuitions elicited by Sher’s nine cases may be too coarse-grained to be useful, especially since those intuitions seem to be generated merely from asking the dangerously ambiguous question: “Is this person responsible for her wrongdoing?” I don’t deny that my inclination in most cases is to say “Yes”, but what I’m less clear about is precisely why I am inclined to give this answer, and I suspect that factors completely independent of those considered in Sher’s book are playing an important role.

What we mean when we say that someone is responsible is, I think, heavily influenced by context. Sometimes we’re interested in trying to draw a line between Joliet and a cleverly disguised automaton; sometimes we’re being asked whether the culprit was Joliet rather than her husband, who we know happened to be out of town at the time of the shooting; sometimes we’re worried about how our view of Joliet as a loving mother ought to be influenced by the incident; sometimes we are trying to decide whether she ought to be incarcerated, or perhaps (what may well be a different question) whether it would be unfair to incarcerate her. In another one of Sher’s cases, On the Rocks, Julian accidentally pilots a ferry into some submerged (but charted) rocks because he has allowed his mind to wander to his girlfriend (p. 24). Certainly Julian is responsible, but what’s driving that judgment? Are we wondering whether he ought to lose his credentials as a ferry pilot? Or are we wondering how this incident will affect our friendship? In general, my worry is that for all we know, there are as many different epistemic conditions as there are senses of ‘responsibility’.1 Which, if any, has Sher identified?

Despite this worry (which applies quite generally to much of the literature on responsibility in any case), Sher’s book is a powerful reminder that theorists of responsibility ought to be taking its epistemic dimension more seriously. It is a superb piece of writing and a significant philosophical contribution.

1 John Martin Fischer and I have attempted to adumbrate some of these senses in our paper, “The Physiognomy of Responsibility”, which is forthcoming in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.