Who Owns You? The Corporate Gold Rush to Patent Your Genes

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David Koepsell, Who Owns You? The Corporate Gold Rush to Patent Your Genes, Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, 187pp., $24.95 (pbk.), ISBN 9781405187305.

Reviewed by Chris Holman, University of Missouri -- Kansas City School of Law



Who Owns You? considers the ethical and public policy implications of so-called “gene patents” from the perspective of a philosopher-attorney who, unfortunately, evidences little technical expertise in either the law or science relevant to the patenting of genes. The book is the product of the author’s 2006-2007 fellowship at the Yale Interdisciplinary Bioethics Center, where much of his efforts apparently focused on a perceived “conundrum” posed by the patenting of genes. The author evidently launched his inquiry into gene patents based on a preconception that these patents pose serious problems for society and never seems to seriously question the validity of this premise, ultimately concluding that gene patents have created significant ethical and policy concerns that should be addressed by banning the patenting of genes.

My background is in biotechnology and patent law, not philosophy, and presumably I was invited to review Who Owns You? based on my experience with the law and science underlying the patenting of genes. I have followed and been actively involved in the ongoing public debate concerning gene patents for years, and have conducted research and written articles specifically focused on human gene patents and their impact on science and society. My overall assessment of the book is that, while evidently the product of sincere and thoughtful consideration, it is fundamentally flawed by the author’s misunderstanding of the fundamental principles of patent law and the nature of gene patents. This misunderstanding results in unfounded conclusions, and it would be unfortunate if policymakers were to use the book as the basis for any changes in patent law or science policy.

The author attempts to set the stage for his philosophical inquiry into the ethics of gene patents by providing primers on molecular biology, patent law, and the patenting of genes. Unfortunately, the primers are rife with misstatements of basic principles of patent law and, to a lesser extent, molecular biology. As a former biochemistry professor, I was annoyed by the author’s confusion as to the distinction between amino acids (the building blocks of proteins) and nucleotides (the building blocks of DNA), and his misuse of basic biological terms such as intron and monoclonal, but aside from confusing readers lacking a background in biology, these errors in nomenclature did not significantly affect the author’s subsequent philosophical exploration of gene patents. However, his fundamental misunderstanding of the basic tenets of patent law and, in particular his mischaracterization of the nature of gene patents, were critical to his conclusion that gene patents have created substantial ethical and policy concerns that ought to be addressed by banning this important category of patents. It is unfortunate that readers of this book sharing the author’s lack of expertise in the subject will come away with a seriously distorted view of what gene patents are and of their impact on society.

For example, the author states that gene patents are a recent aberration resulting from a misinterpretation of the requirements for patentability by the U.S. Patent Office and U.S. courts, asserting that “until recently, patents were limited to inventions, and discoveries were not afforded that right.” In fact, while a distinction between invention and discovery might have intuitive appeal to the author, it has never been part of U.S. patent law, which explicitly specifies that patent protection is available for inventions and discoveries.1 Furthermore, contrary to the author’s suggestion that the supposed problem is confined primarily to the United States, other jurisdictions, notably Europe and Japan, have for years permitted gene patents of the type criticized by the author.2

According to the author, “gene patents are an anomaly” that arose in the 1990s when Celera Corp. (a genomics company) began filing “raw gene patents,” while prior to that time isolated naturally occurring compounds were treated as unpatentable. In fact, to the contrary, there is a long history of patents on isolated forms of naturally occurring biomolecules, including a patent on purified yeast granted to Louis Pasteur, a patent claiming purified human adrenaline, and a patent covering the chemical compound responsible for the flavor of strawberries. As explained in guidelines published by the U.S. Patent Office in 2001, “patenting compositions or compounds isolated from nature follows well-established principles, and is not a new practice.”3 The author cites the guidelines, but then inexplicably criticizes them for mischaracterizing the law, when it is actually the author who is confused on the law. For example, he states that the adrenaline patent cited in the guidelines as an example of a patent claiming an isolated natural compound actually only covered the process of extracting adrenaline, not adrenaline itself. In fact, however, it is the author who is mistaken. The adrenaline patent does cover purified adrenaline, as he would have learned if he had read the legal decision involving the adrenaline patent,4 which is cited in the patent office guidelines.

As yet another example of the misstatements pervading the book, at one point the author suggests that a patent can be granted on a representation of a gene, or the depiction of genetic sequences. However, the U.S. patent statute clearly specifies that patents are only available for products or processes, not representations or depictions of molecules so, once again the purported threat posed by gene patents is a mere red herring based on a misinterpretation of the basic tenets of patent law.

The book repeatedly points to the famous case of Moore v. University of California as a seminal legal decision that, according to the author, changed the law to allow the patenting of genes. This is a total fabrication. While Moore is an important and widely cited case, it had nothing to do with the scope of patentable subject matter or the availability of patent protection for genes or any biological discoveries. In fact, Moore was decided by the California Supreme Court, which lacks any jurisdiction to decide questions of substantive patent law, which is governed solely by federal law. Moore dealt with the ownership rights of the patient in tangible biological materials that were removed from the patient’s body, not with the question of patent rights.

The author also seriously mischaracterizes the rights conferred by a patent. For example, he states that the patent owner’s right is limited to fees or royalties from one who produces or sells a product when, in fact, courts routinely enjoin infringers from making, using, importing or selling products or processes found to infringe a valid patent. He goes on to allege that U.S. patents, including gene patents, have been enforced outside of the U.S. when, in actuality, each country has its own patent law, and a U.S. patent cannot be used to restrict any activity that occurs solely outside the United States.

Some of the most fundamental flaws in the book arise out of the author’s misperception of the scope and legal effect of gene patents. The term “gene patents” is itself something of a misnomer, because it is well established that a patent cannot claim a gene as it exists in nature, such as a naturally occurring gene residing in a human or other biological organism. While it is possible to patent a naturally occurring DNA molecule that has been isolated in a test tube, or introduced into a genetically engineered recombinant cell or organism, that patent would not confer any rights over the gene as it exists in nature.5 The author’s failure to comprehend this fundamental limitation on the scope of gene patents leads to serious misstatements of the potential danger of gene patents. For example, at one point he states that one who has “successfully filed a patent over a non-engineered sheep gene [suddenly becomes] the owner of at least a part of every new and existing sheep in the world.” Later he argues that gene patents “might be an affront to individual liberty and equality” because patent owners “have rights over parts of ourselves over which we as possessors of those parts have no particular rights.” He goes on to conclude that “having babies would actually technically violate a patent if that baby carries a patented gene given it is the result of an unauthorized reproduction.” He then asserts that

technically, each of us carrying a gene that has been patented runs the risk of making unauthorized reproductions simply by virtue of reproducing. When we passed that gene onto our progeny we have technically violated the patent.

All of these scenarios would indeed raise serious ethical concerns if they had any basis in reality, but in fact all are mere figments of the author’s imagination resulting from his profound misunderstanding of patent law.

The author repeatedly assumes that gene patents have already created public policy concerns, without providing any specific examples to support such a claim. For example, he finds that gene patents are already creating a “chilled environment,” without ever explaining what that means or giving any specific example of activity that has been chilled. He then argues that gene patents burden small or emerging biotech companies, without recognizing that small biotech companies are among the most adamant proponents for strong patent rights and the availability of patent protection for genetic sequences.6

Not only is the book based on fundamental misunderstandings of the nature of gene patents, it is in large part derivative of earlier works criticizing gene patents, offering little new to what has become an old debate. Essentially all of the substantive arguments raised against gene patents by the author have previously been made by other commentators. This includes highly public attacks on gene patents by well-known celebrities, scientists and politicians, as exemplified by an op-ed piece by author Michael Crichton that appeared in the New York Times in February of 2007,7 and a bill that was introduced in Congress that same month that would ban the patenting of DNA-based inventions.8 Even the title of the book appears to derive from a leading network of gene patent critics, including Michael Crichton and law professor Lori Andrews, who have for years used the slogan “Who Owns Your Body?” as a rallying cry. For example, they put on a conference in early 2007 entitled “Who Owns Your Body?”9 Curiously, the author does not cite these forerunners in the debate over gene patents.

Some of the book’s deficiencies appear to stem from the author’s tendency to rely on secondary sources rather than primary materials and a failure to acknowledge or cite seminal work that has already been done in this area. For example, in Chapter 7 the author discusses a theory that gene patents can create an “anticommons” that inhibits future research, but fails to note the seminal article on this topic published by Heller and Eisenberg in 1998,10 or subsequent empirical studies finding little evidence of the emergence of an anticommons.11 The author also repeatedly refers to a 2004 Science article that he alleges found about 20% of known human genes to be patented. However, instead of citing to the original article,12 he cites secondary sources that apparently mischaracterize the findings of the article. The author does not appear to have read (or in any event understood) the original article, and fails to appreciate that most of the patents identified in the study are limited to specific processes or genetic constructs involving a human-derived genetic sequence, and do not confer ownership on portions of the genome as stated by the author.13

The author appears to be particularly troubled by the potential for patent owners to profit from genetic discoveries, repeatedly referring to greedy biotechnology companies engaged in a frenzied “gold rush” to stake out claims to the genome, driven by an unseemly desire for profits. For example, the author compares scientists and pharmaceutical companies that profit from the development of drugs based on genetic data to individuals that profited by exploiting the deformities of Joseph Merrick (better known as the “Elephant Man”). The author fails to acknowledge that the potential for profit is a primary driver of the development of life-saving new drugs, without which many of our currently most effective pharmaceuticals would simply not be available. In doing so, he ignores the important role gene patents have played in incentivizing the development of life-saving therapeutics.

At times, the author suggests that gene patents pose impediments for university researchers and small biotechnology companies. If this were the case, however, one would expect that universities and small biotechnology companies would be opposed to gene patents when, in fact, the opposite is true. If the primary sources of biomedical innovation, academic institutions and biotechnology companies, strongly favor patent protection for genetic inventions, it seems imperative that we at least consider the possibility that these stakeholders have some idea as to whether patents promote or impede their endeavors. However, the book fails to acknowledge the positive role of gene patents in incentivizing the sizable investment in biotechnology that has resulted in new and life-saving drugs and diagnostic testing products.

In conclusion, I applaud the author’s attempt to apply philosophical and ethical analysis to the issue of gene patents, a topic that has generated a great deal of attention by academics, policy advocates, and certain members of Congress. These patents have played an important role in incentivizing investment in biotechnology, but have also raised legitimate concerns as to their potential to impede innovation and restrict access to life-saving therapeutic and diagnostic procedures. However, any valid critique of gene patents must originate from an accurate understanding of the nature of gene patents, which this author, unfortunately, lacks. No matter how valid or insightful his philosophical reasoning, his conclusions regarding gene patents and the optimal public policy response are fatally flawed because they are premised on a serious lack of understanding of the nature of gene patents, how they arise, and how they function in the real world. This is particularly problematic when, as in the case of this book, these conclusions purport to be a basis for a dramatic legal change that could have significant unintended negative consequences for future innovation in biotechnology.

1 35 U.S.C 101.

2 Directive No. 98/44, Legal Protection of Biotechnological Inventions, Official Journal of the European Union no. L213 (1998), in particular Articles 5(2), 5(3) and recital 23; Trilateral Project B3b ‘Comparative study on biotechnology patent practices’.

3 Utility and Examination Guidelines, 66 Fed. Reg. 1092 (Jan. 5, 2001), available at http://www.uspto.gov/web/offices/com/sol/notices/utilexmguide.pdf.

4 Parke-Davis & Co. v. H. K. Mulford Co., 189 F. 95, 103 (S.D.N.Y. 1911).

5 C. M. Holman, University of Missouri — Kansas City Law Rev. 76, 295 (2007), available at http://papers.ssrn.com/sol3/papers.cfm?abstract_id=1090562.

6 C. M. Holman, J. Marshall Rev. Intell. Prop. L. 5, 318 (2006), available at http://papers.ssrn.com/sol3/papers.cfm?abstract_id=932050.

7 M. Crichton, N.Y. TIMES, Feb. 13, 2007, p. A23.

8 Genomic Research and Accessibility Act, H.R. 977, 110th Congr. (2007).

10 M. Heller and R. Eisenberg, Science 280, 698 (1998).

11 J .P. Walsh, C. Cho. & W.M. Cohen, Science, 309, 2002 (2005).; T. Buckley, Biotechnology Industry Organization (BIO) Director of Economic Policy, The Myth of the Anticommons, http://www.bio.org/ip/domestic/TheMythoftheAnticommons.pdf.

12 K. Jensen and F. Murray, Science 310, 239 (2004).

13 C. M. Holman, University of Missouri–Kansas City Law Rev. 76, 295 (2007), available at http://papers.ssrn.com/sol3/papers.cfm?abstract_id=1090562.