Who Should Die?: The Ethics of Killing in War

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Ryan Jenkins, Michael Robillard, and Bradley Jay Strawser (eds.), Who Should Die?: The Ethics of Killing in War, Oxford University Press, 2017, 256pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190495657.

Reviewed by Stephen N. Woodside, United States Military Academy


This edited volume is a nice collection of ten original essays on the ethics of defensive harming and war. There are various exceptional essays, of which the three most insightful and carefully argued are Yitzhak Benbaji's "Pre-emptive Rules and the Scope of Defensive Rights," Kai Draper's "Defensive Liability: Four Common Mistakes," and Stephen Kershnar's "An Axiomatic Theory of Just War: Forfeiture Theory." All of the essays are broadly "revisionist" in their approach to the morality of war and do a nice job of advancing some of the most contentious debates within this framework. The rival "traditionalist" approach associated with the work of Michael Walzer is effectively unrepresented.

The concept of moral rights is central to both main rival theories in the ethics of war, but what grounds the right to harm (and the right against being harmed) in each of them is quite different. According to Walzer's traditionalist view, what grounds one's right to harm or one's immunity from being harmed is one's membership in a certain group. Since all soldiers belong to a group whose business is to harm, they have the right to intentionally harm one another, regardless of the moral status of their war. All non-combatants, on the other hand, by virtue of their membership in a group that is not in the business of harming, retain their immunity against being targeted.

Revisionists, led by Jeff McMahan, reject the claim that rights for or against defensive harming in wartime are grounded in one's belonging to a certain group. They claim that the moral rights in war are reducible to the same facts that make one liable to harm in domestic society -- one's individual wrongful behavior. This view is also referred to as "reductive individualism" (RI). If RI is true, then one (combatant or non-combatant) becomes liable to defensive harming in war only if one has done something to forfeit one's presumptive right against being harmed, namely, being sufficiently morally responsible for a threat of unjust harm. From this, it seems to follow that many combatants are not liable and perhaps some non-combatants are liable to be harmed in war. After all, many combatants, particularly just ones, are not responsible for an unjust threat of harm, while some non-combatants (such as scientists contributing to the war effort) are.

While RI now dominates theorizing on the ethics of defensive harming and war, the view, due to three core features of the concept of individual liability, does seem to generate some rather unsavory implications. These three core features are (1) that minimal (that is, non-culpable) moral responsibility for an unjust threat can sometimes be sufficient for liability to defensive harming, (2) that one can be liable only to harm that is necessary to eliminate an unjust threat, and (3) that one can be liable only to proportionate defensive harming. Some of RI's possible problematic implications discussed in the essays are that (a) the net for liability is cast too widely (so that many non-combatants become liable), that (b) innocent victims in cases of futile defense (such as helpless rape victims or small nations) lack the right to harm their culpable and more powerful attackers, and that (c) innocent victims facing culpable aggressors who threaten lesser harms (such as political subjugation) sometimes lack the right of defensive harm. Problem (a) is thought by many to be a consequence of (1), (b) a consequence of (2), and (c) a consequence of (3). Moreover, many believe that were the innocent victims in (b) and (c) to pose a threat of harm in response to their culpable attackers, the former would become liable to counter-defensive harm since the latter would be non-liable. This is difficult for many to accept.

Problem (a): RI casts the net for liability too widely.

In his essay, Draper notes that, as an implication of this view, "McMahan famously ascribes liability to lethal defense even to the conscientious driver who, in spite of his or her attention to safety, ends up posing a threat to the life of an innocent pedestrian" (87-88). The problem with this, according to Draper, is that most, including McMahan perhaps, would also want to assign liability to lethal defensive harm to an individual who makes a small and inessential contribution (such as an inessential drop of poison) to a group's unjust poisoning of a victim (87). Thus, Draper claims that McMahan is committed to the following seemingly inconsistent claims:

(1) low moral responsibility (as in his example of the conscientious driver) does not by itself preclude liability to lethal defense, (2) low causal responsibility (as in my example of the one hundred poisoners) does not by itself preclude liability to lethal defense, but nevertheless (3) low moral responsibility combined with low causal responsibility (as in the case of many, if not most, civilians who contribute to unjust war) somehow does preclude liability to lethal defense. Given (1) and (2), (3) appears to me to be arbitrary. (88)

Thus, Draper seems to suggest that McMahan is committed to the view that many non-combatants in war are liable to defensive harming.

Draper's solution to this problem is to argue that liability "requires posing (or taking part in a group's posing) an unjust threat, as opposed to merely contributing to an unjust threat," where 'posing a threat' means that "unless he or she is prevented from doing so, he or she will infringe upon a right" (84). Draper clarifies this distinction by arguing that the individual who contributes to poisoning a victim does pose a threat of unjust harm, since, unless she is prevented from acting, she will infringe the victim's right not to be harmed by her. In contrast, a gun salesman who blamelessly sells a gun to a person who later commits murder with it is not liable to defensive harming (assuming that this could prevent the crime) since, although he has minimal moral responsibility for contributing to the unjust threat, he does not pose the unjust threat. And this is because, according to Draper, his selling the gun would not infringe the victim's rights since the victim does not have a right "against the gun seller that he or she not sell guns" (88).

I find Draper's articulation of the relevant right here rather dubious. If we followed his line of reasoning, why wouldn't a better articulation of the right be that the victim has a right against the gun seller that he not sell guns to people who would unjustly harm him? If that's the morally relevant right, then the gun seller could be liable to defensive harming, as he would pose an unjust threat to the victim on Draper's definition. In any case, I think there are more plausible explanations for why minimally responsible threats (MRT) like the gun seller (and morally comparable non-combatants) might often be non-liable.

Although these MRTs are similar to the conscientious driver because of their non-culpability, their contributions to unjust threats are much less significant than the driver's (the latter is the direct cause of his threat). And although these MRTs are similar to the inessential poisoner because of their insignificant contributions to their threats, the former are non-culpable, while the latter is fully culpable. Given (1) and (2) then, (3) does not seem arbitrary or inconsistent to me.[1]

Finally, as Draper himself argues, liability is essentially comparative. That is, one is liable to defensive harming only if one's level of moral responsibility for an unjust threat is greater than that of anyone else who could suffer the harm. This is why liability is often referred to as the "just distribution of harm." If that is correct, then we likely have further reason to harm combatants rather than non-combatants. Even if the contributions of a non-negligible number of combatants are comparably significant to those of a large number of civilians, the former, given their likely intentions or epistemic situations, are arguably more responsible for their contributions to the overall threat than their civilian counterparts. Or perhaps more likely, even if the same groups of combatants and non-combatants share the same excusing conditions for their contributions, those of the former group will likely be more significant than those of noncombatants given their causal proximity to the threat of war.

Problem (b): Innocent victims in cases of futile defense (such as helpless rape victims or small nations) lack the right to harm their culpable and more powerful attackers.

Offering a very nice explanation and defense of a forfeiture theory of liability to defensive harm that is compatible with McMahan's and others', Kershnar, in his essay, concedes the following:

The Achilles heel of forfeiture theory is that it depends on an attacker acting unjustly when he imposes an increased risk of a right-infringement . . . or imposes a risk that is a right-infringement. The former . . . is problematic in that posing a risk of right-infringement is not itself a right-infringement. Hence, it is not enough to make the attacker's action unjust. The latter account . . . is better but still problematic. (127)

Kershnar's discussion of the latter account's problems regarding risk is good, but he dismisses too hastily one possible solution to them:

One could escape [the problems associated with risk] by viewing defensive action as justified only if it succeeds in lessoning or preventing an attack, but then ineffective defensive violence is wrong. This is implausible as, on this account, a woman who strikes a rapist to make him stop would act wrongly if her strike accomplishes nothing. This is hard to believe (128).

Benbaji seems to offer us a plausible solution to this problem in his contribution in which he carefully and convincingly argues that there are some situations in which "a defender's right of self-defense might arise from a 'pre-emptive rule' rather than from facts about the liability of the attacker" (33). That is, there might be situations in which a defender has a right to inflict defensive harm on a non-liable attacker without wronging him. Benbaji's "pre-emptive rule" is:

A defender can promote her own interests by harming the attacker in one vs. one (or less) cases, provided that (a) the defender is morally innocent vis-à-vis the threat imposed on her; (b) has no immediately available or obvious evidence that indicates that the attacker is not liable to defensive harm; (c) she does not foreseeably or intentionally harm bystanders by using force against them, cheating them, stealing from them, or any other illicit (but well defined) means (50).

If Benbaji is right, then perhaps RI theorists can maintain that, although the rapist is not liable to the victim's harm, the victim nevertheless has the right to inflict the harm. Although Benbaji's condition (b) is meant to cover cases of effective harming of some innocent threats, it seems plausible that it could extend to cases of ineffective harming of culpable threats. I would be interested to hear more from Benbaji on this and how it might extend to the right to defensive harming in war.

Problem (c): Innocent victims facing culpable aggressors who threaten lesser harms (such as political subjugation) sometimes lack the right of defensive harm.

In "Dignity, Self-Respect, and Bloodless Invasions," Saba Bazargan-Forward notes that RI seems to imply that defensive wars against "bloodless invasions" are impermissible. He sets up the problem here:

Some theorists have cast doubt on the moral permissibility of resisting bloodless invasions on the grounds that such resistance is likely to violate the constraint on proportionality which states that the harms inflicted cannot be too great relative to the wrongful harms thereby averted. Since resisting a bloodless invasion averts threats to nonvital interests by maiming and killing, it seems that such resistance is likely to be unjust, on the grounds that it violates the constraint of proportionality. This is a problematic outcome insofar as a defensive war against an aggressor aiming at imposing unjust political dominion is supposed to be paradigmatic of a just war. (142-3)

Bazargan-Forward's solution to this dilemma is to argue that bloodless invasions, although seemingly insufficient to render lethal violence proportionate, are not fully appreciated with regard to what they threaten. He argues that the loss of the victims' political rights, although insufficient to make the violence of war proportionate, does not fully exhaust the unjust harms to which they are subjected. According to Bazargan-Forward, bloodless invasions also have the potential to severely harm the victims' psychological well-being and their capacity for rational deliberation (161). Thus, the unjust threat posed by bloodless invaders could be sufficiently serious to make defensive wars against them proportionate.

I will now comment on a few of the other notable essays that raise less central, though interesting, issues associated with RI.

In "Distributing Death in Humanitarian Interventions," Lars Christie offers some very nice objections to the "beneficiary thesis" (BT), a view he attributes to McMahan and other RI theorists. According to BT, "it does make a difference to the degree to which noncombatants are morally immune in war whether they are bystanders to military action or expected beneficiaries of it" (187). If BT is true, we might have more reason to harm a group of noncombatants who stand to benefit from the use of force over those who are mere bystanders, even if both groups are non-liable.

While Christie's criticisms of the BT are insightful and convincing, I believe he missed the most plausible objection to BT -- that our intuitions in favor of BT, insofar as we have them, are best explained by our intuitions regarding consent. That is, BT is most plausible in cases in which we find it likely that potential victims would consent to being subjected to a risk of being harmed by the intervener in exchange for an overall decreased risk of being harmed. In other words, BT is really just a proxy for a consent-based reason for harming. If that is the case, then BT as it stands is false. Christie does gesture at this proposal, but he abandons it too quickly.

Susanne Burri's essay "What is the Moral Problem with Killer Robots?" nicely dismisses some rather weak arguments against the use of "lethal autonomous robots" in war, and she offers a nice suggestion for why their employment might be morally preferable -- that they might decrease the risk of harm to non-liable just combatants.

Finally, Lionel McPherson's "Legalism, Justice, and the War on Terrorism," effectively amplifies previous worries raised by Michael Walzer and David Rodin on the over-reliance on intention when attempting to justify harming non-combatants. Furthermore, he offers a convincing pragmatic argument that our current strategy in the war on terror, which he claims does not do enough to minimize the harm to non-combatants, is likely to be unsuccessful, as it will do little "to win the hearts and minds among Muslim peoples" (222). Neither of these is a novel argument, but both are certainly well worked out and timely.

[1] Here is McMahan’s response to Draper’s criticism via personal correspondence: "For the record, I think that a low causal contribution even to a lethal threat normally does preclude liability to lethal eliminative harming. That is, if in killing one of the poisoners, all one would do is to eliminate an inessential drop, so that the killing would be ineffective in saving the victim, then that poisoner is not liable to be killed, for to kill him would violate the necessity constraint. But if his drop were essential, so that eliminating it would save the victim’s life, then he would be liable to be killed, for he would otherwise bear full responsibility for the killing of the victim (as would all others whose contributions were essential). If he were culpable and killing him would eliminate not only his non-essential contribution but also the contributions of the others, then too he would probably be liable to be killed opportunistically. This enables me to accept 3 without inconsistency."