Whose Body Is It Anyway? Justice and the Integrity of the Person

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Cecile Fabre, Whose Body Is It Anyway? Justice and the Integrity of the Person, Oxford University Press, 2006, 256pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199289999.

Reviewed by Anca Gheaus, Université Catholique de Louvain


The vast literature on distributive justice produced in the last decades is mainly concerned with issues such as the proper definition of what is distributive justice, what should be the proper metric of justice and what are the best institutional arrangements that can bring about its implementation. Cecile Fabre's book Whose Body Is It Anyway? is an original attempt to "delineate the rights individuals have over their own and other people's bodies" (p.155), set against the background of a sufficientist theory of liberal egalitarian justice.

Liberal egalitarians argue in favor of a certain amount of redistribution, to be achieved by means of taxation, with the aim of enabling all citizens to lead the minimally flourishing life which they have a right to pursue. But is it possible to achieve this end by means of taxation only, or are there limitations on our ability to lead a minimally flourishing life that can only be removed through policies that redistribute other kinds of resources, which may directly involve citizens' bodies? In her ingenious approach to individual rights and distributive justice, Fabre argues that some of the preconditions to a minimally flourishing life can only be achieved if we recognize that, as a matter of justice, people have a right to others' personal services and bodily organs they need, provided that giving these will not prevent the givers from advancing their own flourishing. In other words, in spite of the widespread current agreement amongst liberals, and in spite of current legislation, we should not have a right to withhold our services and even organs from the needy unless providing them would be too costly to ourselves.

Fabre defends her claim by means of arguing for a rights-based theory of justice. While making a case for acknowledging the rights we have to other people's bodies, Fabre is also arguing that we have rights to dispose of our own bodies, in economically advantageous ways, that are not recognized by most current jurisdiction. The first two chapters of the book set the theoretical framework and the next six argue for particular rights we have concerning other persons' bodies and our own. Chapter three advances the idea of a mandatory civilian service as a way of implementing the right to personal services. Chapters four and five deal with the legitimacy of confiscating, respectively, cadaveric and body parts. In chapter six, Fabre discusses the conditions under which people should be permitted to sell their bodily organs. Chapter seven argues for the legalization of prostitution and chapter eight for that of surrogacy contracts.

Fabre argues that the view that we have rights to other peoples' personal services and bodily organs, is -- in spite of the widespread views of liberal theorists -- consistent with personal autonomy. A consequence of her view on autonomy is that people should be allowed to dispose as they wish of their resources -- bodily and material -- once the requirement of justice has been met and all have the necessary resources to lead a minimally flourishing life. Thus, individuals have a right not to be coerced out of practices that harm them, should they decide -- in full knowledge -- to engage in them. At the same time, however, they should not be allowed to treat others or to let themselves be treated without the respect we owe to persons.

The well-off in terms of bodily resources have, according to Fabre, a duty of justice to provide personal services to the needy, if their needs cannot be met otherwise. The first practical proposal of the book is the organization of a mandatory civilian service, to engage, for one year, all able-bodied citizens in community and care-giving activities meant to help the needy (for instance, in medical institutions, or in shelters for homeless or elderly people asylums). Such civilian service is defended as a way of fulfilling our duties towards those who need our personal services in order to lead a minimally flourishing life and who cannot get such services at decent standards through the market. This service should be mandatory, not allowing the better-off to buy themselves out of it (although a fine is the only proposed penalty for failing to enroll which would amount, in practice, to buying one's way out). While enrolled in it, citizens should receive, as compensation, a subsistence allowance.

Not only personal, but also medical, services bear enough relevant similarity to material resources. Therefore, the better-off with respect to these have, according to Fabre, a duty to help the worst-off in terms of medical needs, as long as this does not prevent the former from leading flourishing lives themselves. One consequence of the similarity between bodily and material resources is that justice requires that we cannot dispose of our bodies after death, in the same way in which we should not entirely decide on our material wealth after death. This is the case for the confiscation of cadaveric organs that can be used to save lives -- or to help them be minimally flourishing. While it is currently very easy to refuse that one's body is posthumously used for the sake of the needy, Fabre suggests a system in which the default situation permits the use of cadaveric organs and from which one can opt out only by invoking conscientious objections related to one's sense of identity.

Similarly, confiscation of living organs should be permitted if they are needed to save lives. This would not lead to the denial of bodily integrity, but to a qualification of it: redistribution of life organs should take place only when the givers' prospects for leading a flourishing life are not thereby endangered.

Taxation, argues Fabre, is coherent with the confiscation of bodily resources; in turn, confiscating bodily resources is coherent with their commercialization. When justice does not entitle people to bodily resources they need in order to pursue their life plans, they should be allowed to purchase such resources.

One instance of such transaction regards bodily organs, which it should be possible to sell and buy under certain conditions, according to Fabre. She discusses and rejects objections to her proposal that invoke commodification and exploitation, and advocates a strict regulation of said transactions.

Prostitution and surrogate motherhood are topics on which much work has been done by feminist philosophers, who have generally criticized these phenomena as unjust and harmful to women. (Here, one may wonder whether a discussion of pornography might have been a welcome addition to Fabre's book.) Fabre's analysis is well aware of and adequately sensitive to the feminist critiques and indeed embraces many of the points made by feminists, without, however, concluding that we should criminalize any of the parties involved in prostitution and surrogate motherhood (i.e. providers, clients or intermediaries). After a detailed discussion of a series of objections related to the commodification of women's work and bodies (and, in the case of surrogacy contracts, of babies), objectification, economic exploitation and gender inequality, she concludes that we have reasons to regulate, rather than ban, contracts between consenting adults selling and buying sexual and reproductive services.

Many feminists who oppose the decriminalization of prostitution because they claim it is deeply harmful to women will probably be unconvinced by Fabre's conclusion. One argumentative strategy of the author is to show that the various harms and risks that apply to prostitution also apply to other paid occupations (although, one may note, no other paid occupation is shown to entail all the harms and hazards of prostitution). If we did not object to the legality of these occupations, then why would we object to prostitution? One possible answer would be, of course, to say that in the case of other occupations there are things we can -- and should -- do in order to mitigate the harms and eliminate the risks while many of the negative consequences of prostitution are inherent to it and thus unavoidable. Another answer would be to define a threshold of harm and say that, if an occupation is likely to constantly take people beyond that threshold, it should not be regarded as a legitimate profession. Prostitution could easily qualify.

There is another objection to prostitution I would like to point out. Fabre openly acknowledges that prostitution is likely to impair prostitutes' capacity to enjoy sexual and emotional life as a consequence of their job. At the same time, she argues that, even in ideal theory, poverty would not necessarily disappear and this is a strong argument for permitting people to sell and buy sexual services. But most people would agree that a core element of leading a minimally flourishing life is to be able to engage in sexual and emotional relationships with others. If prostitution is practiced as the only way out of poverty (as, indeed, is the case with most real-life prostitution and would possibly be the case under ideal theory), even when done voluntarily, one may question whether prostitutes can really be said to have been enabled to lead minimally flourishing lives. If not, this would be a failure of justice. This objection would fail to apply to cases where it can be shown that prostitutes could have chosen another occupation -- and, importantly, that at least one of the alternatives would not prevent them from leading a minimally flourishing life.

As a more general point, it will be very difficult to reject Fabre's approach to prostitution -- which is rights-based, and autonomy-centered -- by appealing to the harms it entails to women. She is boldly arguing that the state has no right to interfere with the choice of autonomous individuals to harm themselves (arguments that apply to selling bodily organs and engaging in surrogacy contracts, as well). However, Fabre acknowledges one kind of harm that we are not entitled to do to ourselves, namely engaging in practices that are systematically degrading to us -- in which our equal dignity is not respected. Together with many feminist critics of prostitution, Fabre is aware that much of prostitution does indeed entail intentional humiliation of prostitutes. (The same applies, perhaps to a lesser extent, to surrogacy contracts in which the future parents instrumentalize the gestational mother and hence fail to treat her with due respect.) However, she concludes that, since there is nothing intrinsically degrading, or humiliating, to prostitution, states should not declare prostitution contracts void since this would run the risk of interfering with the non-degrading, legitimate type of practice. Fabre's willingness to uphold this argument may, however, depend on exactly how widespread degradation through prostitution is judged to be. If the vast majority of acts of prostitution involved degradation (which some feminists consider the case), the practice itself should be judged as illegitimate on Fabre's account.

The problem with setting the standards of what would make prostitution legitimate so high is that legitimate prostitution is so remote from the conditions in which prostitution as we know it is practiced, that Fabre's defense of the right to practice prostitution is of little relevance for the regulation of the actual phenomenon. (As Fabre herself seems to agree.)

As in the case of prostitution, Fabre rejects the claims that surrogacy contracts represent a commodification of children or of the surrogate mother's reproductive services, that they lead to the objectification and/or exploitation of the surrogate mother and that they further gender inequalities. And, as in the case of prostitution, Fabre argues for regulating the practice and declares the contracts voidable, but not void, as a means of protecting the service providers.

One of the strongest objections to surrogacy contracts is that they treat the resulting children as commodities, to be sold by the surrogate mother to the commissioning parents. Fabre rejects this criticism by saying that, since parents do not have ownership rights over children, the transaction is unlike transactions over goods that can be owned: what happens in a surrogacy contract is that one party transfers to the other party the rights to raise the child as an autonomous person. The problem I see with this argument is that it is hard to understand why it could not apply to adoption as well, especially when it is reasonable to believe that the child given for adoption was not created with the aim of being "sold".

An important objection to surrogacy contracts, which renders it different from the case of organ sale or prostitution, is that it may harm the resulting children. Fabre does not reject this objection -- as one may expect -- by invoking the non-identity argument (that it is not possible to harm a not yet existing person by a decision in the absence of which that person would never come into being). Instead, she argues that, while children born by surrogate mothers may suffer in similar ways as children given up for adoption, such suffering is probably more than mitigated by being raised in a loving family. This answer, however, does not seem good enough to me. First, the level of suffering connected to adoption is far from trivial, and is caused not only by the knowledge that one has been given up by one's parents (as Fabre notes) but also by the lack of knowledge of one's biological family. This is at least what testimonies of children who have been adopted or created with the help of anonymously donated sperm indicate. Second, children born by surrogate mothers have even more reason to suffer than adopted children, since they cannot find any consolation in the thought that, at least at some stage of their coming into existence, they might have been desired by their surrogate mother. Moreover, in spite of the fact that -- as Fabre argues -- monetary and non-monetary meanings can coexist, a child born by a surrogate mother may entertain the reasonable suspicion that, in her particular case, the monetary meaning had prevailed and that she has been treated as a commodity by one or both of the contracting parties.

Finally, surrogacy, according to Fabre, should be permitted because people have a (negative) right to raise biological children. But then, is it not plausible that people should also have a right to be brought up by their biological parents, when possible? Contracts for (partial) surrogacy are, by definition, envisaging the creation of children who will not be raised by one of their natural parents.

The book is very structured and carefully argued in a clear and linear prose and extremely consistent in the use of philosophical terminology.