Why Arendt Matters

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Elisabeth Young-Bruehl, Why Arendt Matters, Yale University Press, 2006, 232pp., $22.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780300120448.

Reviewed by James Bernauer, Boston College


Readers of Hannah Arendt will be pleased that her former student and outstanding biographer, Elisabeth Young-Bruehl, decided to turn into print some of her own wonderings about how Arendt might think about today's crises in light of her philosophical-political analyses of the past.  This volume enables us to become privileged listeners to a uninterrupted dialogue that Young-Bruehl has had with her famous mentor: "I think of what I am doing now as a conversation with her, a continuation into the present of the conversation I have been having with her in my mind since 1968." (15)  She profits from the availability of Arendt's correspondence that has been published in the years since her death but the richness of Young-Bruehl's book is rooted even more in a superb comprehensive grasp of Arendt's writings and of how she came to arrive at the judgments contained within them.  In each of the book's three chapters, Young-Bruehl focuses on one of the major texts.  The first chapter relates The Origins of Totalitarianism to our current century.  The second chapter deals with The Human Condition and "actions that matter."  The last chapter reflects on The Life of the Mind.  Although Young-Bruehl is particularly interested in presenting Arendt to an audience of young students, her treatment is also a contribution to those of us who have been reading Arendt for years.  She gives all of us a window into the wisdom of Arendt's mind, especially its hunger to get clear about what is novel, of what is unparalleled in the experiences we confront in our times.  Near the conclusion of the exhibit on German Jewish history in Berlin's Jewish Museum, there is a video interview with Arendt in which she testifies to the unprecedented character of what was revealed in Auschwitz, its non-utilitarian fabrication of corpses, the revelation of an abyss that, in her case at least, evoked a remarkable intellectual creativity.  I left the museum with gratitude for the past existence of German Jewry and for the life of Arendt, its politically thinking daughter.  Young-Bruehl's consideration of Arendt renews that gratitude.

Anyone who has taught The Origins of Totalitarianism appreciates its depth and complexity as well as its resistance to easy summary analysis.  Arendt weaves its great sections on anti-semitism, imperialism and totalitarianism from detailed reviews of historical contingencies, literary intuitions and philosophical reflections.  Young-Bruehl has a handsome image for the experience of reading this first major work of Arendt: it is "like visiting a museum where there is a giant mural of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries that you can never finish taking in -- a vast historians' Guernica." (33)  While treating totalitarianism's practice of terror and destruction of human bonds, it is not surprising that Arendt's approach to ideology is featured because her revulsion at ideological proclamations of total explanations for history and nature is one of the most vivid of the insights a viewer of that mural carries away from it.  It is an insight that prepares one for critical reaction to the religious fundamentalisms of today with their claims to a "supersense."  A this-worldly politics and judgment is a needed response to the fantasies of total explanation: "For those who subscribe to them, religious ideologies have an irrefutable logic, one that makes no sense to nonbelievers because the premises are not of the common world and not related to common sense." (49) 

The wisdom of Arendt's The Origins of Totalitarianism points for Young-Bruehl in several directions.  First is renewed appreciation for the novel events that are appearing in American experience.  I believe it is salutary to be reminded of the lingering blindness released by our atomic bombing of Hiroshima.  How much dehumanization had developed in order to permit the erasure of the distinction between combatants and civilians in our war policies?  "In Japan an estimated 160,000 people were directly killed in a day, and there was no real national debate in America -- then or since -- over this result." (55-56)  The absence of that debate perhaps facilitated the radical insecurity and  antiquated screen through which we were encouraged to view the attacks of September 11, 2001.  "It is important to recognize that this radical insecurity is connected to the fact that the attack was not an act of war, despite President Bush's terminology." (64-65)  Calling it an act of war made it unnecessary to think afresh, to grasp its departure from standard wars.  The Origins also directs attention to how people are mapped in such a way as to make them describable as "superfluous" and to the historically ongoing assault upon limited nation-states.  The radical Islamists' ideological rhetoric of supernationalism seems to resemble America's current unilateralist policy which "would be much more accurately described as an antipolitics, an attack upon existing alliances with the intention of clearing a path for a renewal and continuation of American overseas imperialism" (72).

Young-Bruehl's second chapter is largely devoted to The Human Condition and Arendt's effort to resurrect the human capacity for political action, an ability that was so buried during the period of totalitarianism.  Arendt wanted to entitle the book "amor mundi" (love of the world) because she saw the crimes of totalitarianism as flowing from a contempt for the world that was rooted in our western religious and philosophical traditions.  I personally think that this "love of the world," the subordination of personal projects to the more significant shared public realm, is Arendt's greatest contribution to our understanding of politics and Young-Bruehl's presentation of it very smartly concentrates on the two powers which Arendt saw as so significant for promoting engagement in political action: promising and forgiving.  Indeed, Young-Bruehl claims that Arendt anticipated how these activities would be reevaluated in a post-totalitarian politics. 

And this anticipation of hers, I also think, is the crucial aspect to elaborate on when we ask what her understanding of action can offer us now, when both forums for forgiveness and forums for making promises have appeared in unprecedented ways in councils and conventions. (96) 

The promising of those in the American Revolution, for example, created a special freedom, a virtuosity that enabled the future to be ripped from the grip of arbitrary chance and given the direction of shared purpose.  As I compose this review, Europe is celebrating the 50th anniversary of the Treaty of Rome that established the common market and the European Union, surely a model of what Arendt means by the potential of promising.  Although most fully articulated in a religious context by Jesus, forgiving is an extraordinary worldly power because it enables the participant in politics to live in the truth and to be freed from the inevitable mistakes of acting in the world.  Among the examples of this act's contemporary relevance which Young-Bruehl gives is the South African Truth and Reconciliation Commission (TRC) which, "for the first time in history, made forgiveness a guiding principle for a state." (112)  Young-Bruehl's examination of the nuances of these two powers are among the most illuminating and hopeful pages of her volume, and, indeed, of any recent work in political thought that I know of.  I also very much admire how Young-Bruehl salvages the potential of a distinction that Arendt makes between the socioeconomic and the political while acknowledging that they are far too intertwined for Arendt's strict division to survive. Young-Bruehl counsels:

Her distinction should function now as a constant reminder of how crucial it is for the political domain to be, as much as is possible, the domain for decision making about economic and social concerns, and how crucial it is for political discussion and decision making to be different from what goes on in corporate boardrooms and free, as much as possible, from corporate influence. (142)

Young-Bruehl's final chapter considers many of the themes developed in or promised by the posthumously published Life of the Mind, especially the practices of thinking, willing and judging.  Central to Arendt's own working through of these practices was the case of Eichmann and her frequently misunderstood "banality of evil" thesis.  She attributed to Eichmann a thoughtlessness, an absence of conversation with himself that enabled him to function without compunction as a vehicle for mass murder even though he was possessed by no daemonic passion or ambition.  Why did Socrates think it better to suffer harm rather that commit it?  And why did he think that it was better to be out of harmony with everyone in the world rather than with oneself?  Socrates had understood how committing evil deeds or being disharmonious with oneself subverted the conversation with oneself about the meaning and moral significance of one's acts.  Eichmann's thoughtlessness demonstrated the accuracy of Socrates's insight.

Arendt matters because she grasped many of the forces that produced totalitarianism and that have led us to where we are today, and she understood that only a love for the world and for action within it could deal with the negative dimensions of those forces.  She demonstrates how a thinking person may contribute to the renewal of our world, our politics, our moral stature.  We are reminded that a "bureaucracy is a good place to become a thoughtless person, but any job will do as long as the person doing it is only doing a job." (151)  A society of job holders will never be adequate protection from moral and political disasters.  Arendt's political community of engaged world loving citizens might be up to the challenge.  For recalling Arendt's vision and its promise for today we are indebted to Elisabeth Young-Bruehl's fine study.