Why Does Inequality Matter?

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T. M. Scanlon, Why Does Inequality Matter?, Oxford University Press, 2018, 170pp., $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198812692.

Reviewed by Jonathan Wolff, University of Oxford


More than four decades of reflection on the idea of equality -- or rather inequality -- are distilled into this extremely impressive, thought-provoking, yet slim, volume. It is written in simple, jargon-free terms, originally delivered as the 2013 Oxford Uehiro Lectures. Scanlon describes his position as 'relational' and 'pluralistic', but declines to give it a name. The simplicity of the writing, and the brevity of some arguments, means it contains subtleties that might well be missed by the casual reader; such is philosophical life. But I will try to draw out the main themes.

The framing of the discussion is in terms of setting out objections to inequality, rather than providing arguments for equality. This seems less to do with any grand theory about methodology, but rather an appreciation of the argumentative landscape. Scanlon doubts that a single theory will encapsulate equality in any really substantive sense. Rather, he wants to consider what the plausible objections to inequality are. The overarching message is that the many such possible objections need to be distinguished and assessed.

Some opponents of egalitarianism will respond to Scanlon by arguing that some people are morally entitled to more than others; for example, in recognition of liberty, property rights, or desert. He briefly considers and rejects each of these arguments (more below), but he spends more time considering a different type of opponent: someone who replies to the objections to inequality that he gives. Scanlon's responses are uniformly thoughtful and important. But as they are at the level of the negation of the negation of the negation of the negation, their significance is easily overlooked. Still, it is not easy to think of a more immediate way of presenting the material.

Scanlon explores the issues with care, seeking to isolate the precise force of any sound position or intuition, often showing that its implications are much narrower than is often assumed. For example, at one point he accepts that there is merit in the libertarian idea of self-ownership. Yet he is quick to point out that the form in which this idea is appealing has no implications for taxation, and hence there is no valid jump from self-ownership to an opposition to taxation, even though this is libertarian standard fare. I would characterise Scanlon as always being on the look-out for what we could call 'reason-drift' by which I mean trying to do more with a value or argument than can be justified. Many discussions in the book have this character. It is also part of the book's official motivation to understand when objections to inequality are based on egalitarian reasons and when other factors. For example, in the case of global health, is what horrifies us the inequality in life expectancy between wealthy and poor countries, or is it simply the shockingly and unnecessarily low level in poor countries? (As an aside, in his discussion of health inequalities Scanlon writes that male life expectancy in Malawi is 37.1 years. The WHO gives the much higher figure of 61.)

Scanlon's earlier work distinguished five different reasons for objecting to inequality, some of which went through subtle shifts over the years. These take up chapters 2 to 6, after the Introduction, namely: Equal Concern; Status Inequality; Procedural Fairness, Substantive Opportunity and Political Fairness. There are additional chapters on Equality, Liberty, and Coercion; Desert; Unequal Income; and a concluding chapter. Scanlon makes clear that he assumes rather than argues for 'basic equality' and emphasises one key feature of the considerations he will discuss: that they all presuppose some sort of relation between individuals, in contrast to views that concentrate only on the comparison of individual shares of resources or well-being.

The first substantive reason for objecting to inequality, equal concern, is the subject of Chapter 2. Suppose a government decides to give priority in paving roads to the neighbourhoods of the rich, simply because it favours them. It therefore fails to treat the poor with equal concern and they have a legitimate complaint. However, if geological or climactic factors make it a priority to pave some roads first, and they happen to be the streets where the rich live, there is no justified objection, unless it so happens that all the decisions seem to go the same way. Hence equal concern is not shown by equal outcomes, but equal consideration in the reasons for policies, by the agent or authority in control of the situation. Scanlon is sensitive to the criticism that equal concern is alleged, sometimes, to lead to levelling down, where all are denied a benefit because not all can have it. His answer is that what matters is not the outcome but the reasons behind it. Hence a lottery could be a way of showing equal concern in the distribution of a scarce good. Furthermore, in some competitive situations, such as the justice system, levelling down may be the correct response. But in every case we need to consider the balance between the competitive and the non-competitive aspects of the good.

Chapter 3 takes us to status inequality, for Scanlon a key reason for objecting to inequality. The general case is one where people are denied access to goods, rights and 'associational goods' (friendships, etc.) on the basis of characteristics, such as gender or skin colour that do not provide reasons to support discrimination. Of course, discrimination is often backed up by false generalisations that correlate possibly relevant factors (such as motivation) with the overt basis of discrimination. But even if these correlations are statistically true, they do not justify discriminatory treatment of an individual. The situation is even worse if those discriminated against internalise their inferiority. Indeed Scanlon argues that both sides suffer, as they are deprived of opportunities to relate to each other as equals.

Scanlon is aware that those who are privileged may well object to changes which reduce their elite status, but in a characteristic and insightful move he argues that they have no good objection as the feeling of superiority is not something to which they are morally entitled. Scanlon recognises that certain features, such as highly developed talents, are needed for economic efficiency (to which I will return), and this generates a concern for him, asking how can we encourage the idea that some talents are very much worth developing without endorsing a society in which some will feel a justified, and objectionable, lack of status and self-esteem? This is clearly something that bothers him, as the problem also recurs later.

The topic of Chapter 4 is procedural fairness, about which Scanlon makes the very appealing suggestion that it is part of a three-level response to an objection to inequality. Consider an institution, such as a firm, that has different roles and rewards, some of which are high status and high pay. A critic might object to these inequalities. It may be that there is no good reason for them, and the objection holds. But there can be cases where socially we need institutions with differential roles and rewards, for, perhaps, reasons of economic efficiency or allocation. This is the first, institutional, response to the objection to inequality. Nevertheless, we can still ask who should be allocated those high status, high paid roles. Scanlon's answer is that two further conditions must be met: procedural fairness and substantive opportunity (the subject of the next chapter).

Suppose the situation is that in order to perform a certain job a level of talent and qualification is required, but it is not all that uncommon and many more people have the qualification than are needed. From the point of view of economic efficiency it may make sense to use some characteristic to reduce the field. But unless that is done very carefully it is likely to be procedurally unfair, reinforcing privilege. On the other hand, giving everyone full and equal attention could absorb a disproportionate level of resources. Hence there is a real dilemma for the selecting institution. Nevertheless, Scanlon appears to side with fairness over efficiency, though he does point out that lotteries, once more, are likely to be fairer than other grounds. But not always. There will be cases where affirmative action can also be justified, for example by attempting to overcome stigma and discrimination against people from excluded groups by recruiting them into positions where they can be seen to perform well and thereby overcome stereotypes, as a transitional step.

Chapter Five moves to the third element in the defence of justified inequalities, substantive opportunity. This is the familiar idea that procedural fairness will not serve those who were not in a position to acquire the talents necessary to succeed. Scanlon adopts a modified version of Rawls's suggestion that openness to all is a condition on the justification of inequality of reward. Scanlon's detailed modification of Rawls repays examination. His key message is that choice is only significant from a political point of view if it is made under good conditions. To explain: if someone declined to apply for a job out of ignorance or low talent which was the result of poor education, that is not a good justification of any resulting inequality. It is only if they made their choice under good conditions that it has that justifying role, and providing good conditions is the role of education.

Political fairness, the last of the five objections to inequality from previous work, is the topic of Chapter 6. The rich have much greater influence than the poor on the political process, and it is no surprise that they more often get what they want. Part of Scanlon's discussion concerns whether the effects of unequal wealth on the political process can be mitigated, or whether the problem is so serious that dramatic wealth disparities should be prevented. Yet, as he ruefully observes, once these inequalities exist and influence the political process, it becomes increasingly difficult to do anything about them.

Chapter 7 is a fascinating discussion of equality, liberty and coercion. Drawing on Hayek, Scanlon accepts that there are two main reasons for valuing liberty: being able to do what you want; and not being subject to the will of another. Scanlon argues that these justifications for personal liberty do not provide grounds for a strong liberty-based defence of inequality. If anything, they are reasons for ensuring everyone has the resources they need to purse their goals. Liberty, he argues, should allow us to transact with others on mutually beneficial terms, but it does not follow that proceeds should be untaxed; just that the tax should not be so heavy as to be a disincentive to the transaction. So, for example, people should be able to sell their house and move, but this does not mean profits should be free of tax. Similarly, the plausibility of self-ownership in labour rests on considerations of occupational freedom, but it does not follow that you are entitled to 'full value' of what you do.

There are, Scanlon argues, two types of good reason for tax. One is the familiar fact that money is needed to provide public goods. The other is much more distinctive and gets us to the heart of his position: tax is needed to meet the conditions arising from the legitimacy of the property regime and exchange. If I understand it correctly, his argument starts from the rejection of non-institutional property rights (and, in the next chapter, is complemented by the near-rejection of pre-institutional desert). This leads to the view that the justification of property rights depends on their being part of a system that works to the benefit of all. Hence if property is so concentrated in privileged hands, that, for example, some people are unable to find a home, then it has fallen foul of its own conditions of justification. Redistribution, or basic income, is then necessary to protect the system of property inequality from justified criticism. This is a very striking argument, and could be contested in various ways, as it makes assumptions about the cooperative nature of society, and the need to justify arrangements to everyone. These, of course, are natural outcrops of Scanlon's contractualism, which he has defended elsewhere (Scanlon 1998), but their presence in this book is both very light yet very consequential.

Scanlon's view of desert is dealt with at length in Chapter 8. In short, he argues that almost all desert arises in the context of institutions, and its justification depends on what is needed to allow those institutions to serve their legitimate purposes. For this reason institutions themselves cannot be criticised in terms of failing to reward people in accordance with their non-institutional deserts. Scanlon does concede that there is some room for non-institutional desert with respect to talents or special abilities. However, its suitable recognition is admiration and praise, rather than economic rewards.

Chapter 9 discusses the pressing political question of unequal incomes which have reached staggering proportions in recent decades. Extreme income inequality threatens equality of opportunity as well as equality of political influence, and the mechanisms self-reinforce. Yet these consequentialist arguments do not capture the feeling that growing inequality is wrong, or unfair, in itself. In essence, Scanlon's position is that inequalities are acceptable only to the degree that they are either inevitable consequences of people expressing their liberty to live as they wish, or if they are in the interests of all. This is a weaker requirement than the Difference Principle, and one that he thinks underpins the general sense of unfairness regarding great inequalities which do not serve the general interest. The same argument, Scanlon thinks, pushes us to the Difference Principle, maximising the position of the worst off, although it is not needed to condemn the current level of inequalities. On Scanlon's relational view what matters is not the inequality, but the institutions that produce it. There is no general answer to the question of when inequalities are unfair, but only about the underlying institutional mechanisms.

Scanlon summarises his view by saying it is egalitarian at two levels. At the abstract level inequalities must be justified to those asked to accept them, in a way that takes all of their interests seriously and gives them equal weight. And at more specific level it sets out a series of justified objections people have to being treated unequally.

As I read Scanlon, the philosophical weight of his project rests on his view that there is no interesting substantive analysis of equality that will advance our understanding. Inequality is what matters, and it comes in a number of forms. For many years Scanlon's readers yearned for a simple, positive, unifying statement of his view. He resisted. And his patience has been rewarded. The current literature has taken up the pluralistic, relational view that Scanlon has always advocated. This volume makes clear why. Its originality, force, depth and good sense will make itself apparent to the careful reader.


Scanlon, T.M. (1998) What We Owe Each Other (Cambridge: Harvard University Press).