Why Free Will Is Real

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Christian List, Why Free Will Is Real, Harvard University Press, 2019, 215pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674979581.

Reviewed by Peter A. Graham, University of Massachusetts Amherst


In this book Christian List sets his sights high indeed: he aims not only to argue for the compatibility of free will and determinism, but also to argue for the reality of free will in the actual world. He goes about doing this by arguing that the three most substantial challenges to the actual existence of free will can be met.

According to List, free will is a three-part capacity, requiring intentional agency, alternative possibilities, and causal control. These three requirements he takes to be necessary and sufficient for a being's having free will in the sense that matters to us when we wonder whether we ourselves have free will. More particularly, List sets out three theses which he contends must be true, and which are jointly sufficient, for a being to have free will:

Intentional Agency: Any bearer of free will is an intentional agent, whose intentions support the relevant actions (i.e., those actions performed freely).

Alternative Possibilities: Any bearer of free will faces the choice, at least in relevant cases (i.e., those cases in which she exercises her free will), between two or more alternative actions, each of which is a genuine possibility for the agent.

Causal Control: The relevant actions (i.e., those that are the product of free will) of any bearer of free will are caused, not merely by some nonintentional processes, but by the appropriate mental states, viz., the intentions to perform those actions.

To show that free will is in fact real, List sets out to respond to what he takes to be the main challenges posed by aspects of our contemporary scientific worldview to these theses.

The challenge to Intentional Agency is the challenge of radical materialism. Radical materialism consists of either eliminative materialism or reductive materialism. According to eliminative materialism, scientifically speaking, there is no such thing as intentional agency. This is because, according to it, the idea of there being mental states such as intentions, desires, and beliefs is a relic of our folk/prescientific worldview which contemporary science has shown (or will show) to be just as ill-founded as it has shown the idea that thunder and lightning are the manifestations of divine displeasure to be. Rather, explaining the behavior and functioning of agents, be they human or non-human, will be shown to be the province not of folk psychology, but of neurobiology, neurochemistry, and ultimately, neurophysics. According to reductive materialism, mental states such as beliefs, desires, and intentions, though perhaps not eliminable, are reducible to neurophysical states. If either form of radical materialism were true, then there would be no non-eliminated or non-reduced-away intentional states. And, as there can be no intentional agency, without intentional states, likewise there would be no real free will.

The challenge to Alternative Possibilities is the challenge of determinism. For most of scientific history, the world has been thought to be deterministic. A deterministic world is just one for which it is true that any complete microphysical description of the past of that world prior to some time, t, in conjunction with the laws of nature of that world entails the complete microphysical description of the future of that world from t onward. It is thought by many that if the world is deterministic, that precludes anyone from ever having free will with respect to any choice she in fact makes. If it were determined far before I was born that I would be writing this sentence right now, how could it have been true that I had any alternatives aside from writing this sentence available to me? But if there were no genuine alternative actions available to me, then I did not exercise free will in writing the sentence, i.e., I couldn't have not written it. And so for every action that any agent performs throughout the course of history of the entire world. So, if determinism is true, no one has any free will. Now it is true that, because of the apparent indeterminism of quantum mechanics, many contemporary scientists believe that the world is not in fact deterministic. But the threat of determinism lingers for two reasons: (1) there are deterministic interpretations of quantum mechanics, which, if true, would render our current scientific view of the world as deterministic as Laplace thought it to be, and (2) quantum mechanical indeterminism may "wash out" at the macro-level, i.e., at the macroscopic level things may be perfectly deterministic even if they are indeterministic at the microscopic level. So, the threat of determinism to Alternative Possibilities is very much a live one.

The challenge to Causal Control derives from an argument offered Jaegwon Kim, viz., the causal exclusion argument. According to the conclusion of the causal exclusion argument, anything a being does is wholly caused by nonintentional processes, and so an agent's intentions are mere epiphenomenal byproducts of the underlying physical causes. The causal exclusion argument proceeds by way of two theses: the causal closure of the physical world -- anything that happens in the world must ultimately have a sufficient physical cause -- and the causal exclusion principle -- except in clear cases of causal overdetermination, one sufficient cause of an event is all there is. To deny the causal closure of the physical world would be to embrace an objectionable supernaturalism and to deny the causal exclusion principle would be to embrace an implausible gratuitous causal overdetermination. It follows from the causal closure of the physical world that any bit of an agent's behavior has a perfectly physical, i.e., nonintentional, cause, and it follows from the causal exclusion principle that that physical, nonintentional cause is the only cause of that bit of behavior. It thus follows from these two principles that every bit of behavior of every being in the world is nonintentionally caused; and so no being has causal control over what she does, i.e., no being does what she does causally because she intended to do it. So, if epiphenomenalism, the thesis according to which all intentions are mere epiphenomena, is true, then no one has free will.

List's answers to these challenges all involve an appeal to the world's having different levels above the most fundamental level, levels at which new phenomena can emerge. In essence, his response to each of the challenges to free will laid out above is to point out that free will is an upper-level phenomenon and because of that does not fall prey to the challenge. Below I detail how he deploys this strategy with respect to the various challenges to free will he considers.

To the challenge to Intentional Agency from radical materialism List responds by arguing that intentions and intentional behavior are neither eliminable nor ultimately reducible to any lower-level non-intentional phenomena. And this is because intentional explanations of the behavior of agents (humans and other "higher" non-human animals) are explanatorily indispensable. That is, explanations of that behavior in terms of the beliefs, desires, and intentions of agents are better on explanatory grounds than any actual or even potential future explanation in the terms of any other lower scientific discipline, say that of biology, chemistry, or physics. The intentional explanations are more parsimonious, and they are more counterfactually robust, than any other replacement lower-level explanation. This explanatory indispensability grounding of the reality of intentional explanations of behavior follows from the tenets of any plausible naturalistic ontological attitude -- according to which that which exists is that which is posited by our best scientific theories of the world -- and so intentional explanations of behavior are not unnecessary relics of our ill-informed folk sciences, but, rather, are on as sure a naturalistic footing as the posits of any other science. So, contra the challenge to Intentional Agency from radical materialism, there is intentional agency in the world, and so there are no grounds for denying the existence of free will from that quarter.

In reply to the challenge of determinism to Alternative Possibilities, List again appeals to the multi-level metaphysical layering of the world. In essence, List contends that though there might indeed be determinism at the fundamental physical level (i.e., the level of microphysics), that determinism is compatible with there being indeterminism at the agential level (i.e., the level of psychology and our best social sciences (those that trade in explanations in terms of agents' beliefs, desires, and intentions)). And it is that indeterminism at the agential level that is all that is required for free will, in the sense we care about. (He also demonstrates that indeterminism at the fundamental level is also compatible with determinism at the agential level.) What's more, List offers more than just this defensive compatibility argument in defense of Alternative Possibilities against the threat of determinism. He also provides a positive, naturalistic argument for Alternative Possibilities -- to wit, that many of our best social scientific theories of agency and behavior (including disciplines such as psychology, and behavioral and social sciences such as economics and decision theory) represent people as making choices between different alternative courses of action, and so, given that we ought to believe in the actual existence of the posits of our best scientific theories, there are naturalistic grounds for maintaining that Alternative Possibilities is true. So, as there need be no determinism at the relevant level, the agential level, and there are broadly naturalistic reasons in its favor, even if physical determinism is true, it poses no threat to Alternative Possibilities, and so there are no grounds for denying the existence of free will on the basis of physical determinism.

List's reply to the challenge to Causal Control is to disambiguate the notion of sufficient cause in play in the causal closure and causal exclusion principles and show that on either interpretation of that notion, one of them is false. The disambiguation he posits is that between a notion of sufficient cause which means something like 'a nomologically sufficient condition' and a notion of sufficient cause which means something like 'a difference-making cause'. A difference-making cause, C, of event, E, is (roughly speaking) just one for which the following two counterfactuals hold:

  1. If C were to occur, then E would occur.
  2. If C were not to occur, then E would not occur.

(The first conditional being "the positive conditional" and the second being "the negative conditional".) Although the physical realizer of the putative mental cause is a nomologically sufficient condition for the putative effect of the mental cause -- the causal closure of the physical being obviously true on this notion of a sufficient cause -- on this notion of a sufficient cause, the causal exclusion principle is false: it clearly needn't be the case that an event can only have one other event as a nomologically sufficient condition for it. If, on the other hand, by 'sufficient cause' we mean something like a difference-making cause, then though the causal exclusion principle may be true -- insofar as it is entirely possible that the relevant difference-making regularities occur at only one level -- the causal closure principle is false: it is not the case that every higher-level effect has a lower-level difference-making cause, for, in many cases (and, in particular, in the case of mental causation) the cross-level negative conditional might fail to hold for any pair of particular lower-level realizer of the putative higher-level cause (the mental state in question) and the higher-level effect. So, the causal exclusion argument is unsound (either by the falsity of one of its premises or by invalidity due to equivocation).

In all, this book is a gem. It is exceptionally clear and rigorously argued, and at the same time accessible even to those with only scant knowledge of the traditional free will debate. The only gripe I have is that its discussion of the challenge to Alternative Possibilities from determinism is incomplete in that it lacks a discussion of Peter van Inwagen's famous Consequence Argument. That argument is the main reason most contemporary incompatibilists think that determinism threatens Alternative Possibilities. In essence, the argument purports to establish that having the ability to do otherwise in a deterministic world entails having the ability either to change the laws of nature or to alter the distant past before one was born, neither of which any human agent has. Without addressing this argument, the challenge to Alternative Possibilities from determinism has not been rebutted and the case for the existence of free will has not been made.

Now it's not as if List hasn't addressed the Consequence Argument. He has. Just not in this book. In List (2019) he argues that the Consequence Argument rests on a category mistake: the mistake of thinking that one can coherently make claims that mix descriptions of the world at various different levels. Though this is an interesting proposal (though also far from obviously correct), here is not the place to evaluate it. One only wonders why List didn't include this discussion of the Consequence Argument in the book, for only with it can he have truly said to have established that free will is real. (Now it might be that including his discussion of the Consequence Argument might have involved including material above the level (pun intended!) at which he meant to pitch this defense of the existence of free will. But, all the same, the increased complexity notwithstanding, the book would have benefited significantly from its inclusion.)

I highly recommend this book to anyone interested in the contemporary free will debate. I also recommend that List (2019) be read in conjunction with it, for only together do they constitute a complete defense of the reality of free will.


List, Christian. 2019. "What's Wrong with the Consequence Argument?" Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 119(3): 253-274.