Many philosophers are skeptical about the suggestion that the natural or social sciences can tell us anything philosophically interesting about ethics. This skepticism need not be motivated by the conviction that no explanation is possible of why humans, or a culture, or an individual, hold the moral attitudes we do. Rather, one can doubt the usefulness of any such explanation for the normative questions—about what we should believe and how we ought to act—that fall within the purview of ethics. Such skepticism seems to me too sweeping and peremptory; I think there are many ways in which the descriptive tasks of an anthropology or psychology of morals can properly contribute to ethical thought. It is particularly disheartening, then, to read a work that aspires to bring empirical results to bear on ethics but fails at the task. Unfortunately, that is my conclusion about Robert Hinde’s book, Why Good is Good. Hinde’s explanations do little to elucidate why cultures and individuals hold the moral beliefs they do; and even if these explanations were more satisfactory, his efforts to derive normative conclusions from them would fail.
As his title promises, Hinde occasionally attempts to offer explanations of moral principles that also function as justifications of them. Elsewhere, however, he seems content with the explanatory part of the project—in which case the book should have been called something like “Why We Think Certain Things Are Good.” There is a deep tension running throughout this work between the more modest (but still extremely ambitious) explanatory project, and the attempt to derive evaluative conclusions from this speculation. Here is a characteristic example of this tension, taken from the book’s conclusion:
The approach to morality discussed here finds no need to postulate absolute standards of right and wrong that are independent of the basic principles incorporated into the self-systems of individuals. The code that we have has been honed over the generations in the social situation in which we live. The precepts do not always give us all that we need to solve moral dilemmas, but we then use the basic principles. Since those principles are pan-cultural, and their influence a consequence of human nature, they provide a means to meet some of the difficulties that arise when cultures clash, and especially those that arise in multicultural societies. (189)
Even after reading Hinde’s book, I confess that I am unsure about the meaning of this crucial passage. Is he claiming that there are in fact pan-cultural moral principles, but these are not absolute standards of right and wrong? Or is it that such putatively universal principles are indeed absolute standards, but they are not independent of the “self-systems” of individuals? One difficulty in understanding this claim is that the notion of a self-system, like most of Hinde’s central concepts, is obscure. It seems to be much like a conscience, except that Hinde wants to allow something that “seems strange to individualistic Western ears”: that the self-system can “embrace information external to the individual” (38). But on one reading this is true of any conception of the word that isn’t solipsistic; on another, it is unclear why this should be called a self-system at all, rather than something like a set of social norms. “The important issue,” we are told, “is that that the self-system functions in interpersonal relationships and enables the individual to make choices and initiate actions” (38). Yet this explanation seems to presuppose those Western notions of individuals (who engage in interpersonal relationships) and personal responsibility (which issues in choices about what to do) that are claimed to be contingent and problematic.
Elsewhere, Hinde criticizes the idea that morality can be “rationally constructed or justified.” His explanation is as follows: “If ‘rationally constructed’ implies the existence of an external standard against which its construction could be monitored, it would appear to involve a dualism differing only in degree from belief in a transcendental authority” (185). This is the sort of remark Hinde is wont to throw off without explanation. We are not told what sort of dualism he has in mind, or how the claim that some principles are better supported by reasons than others is like belief in the transcendental authority of morality. When it serves his purposes, Hinde routinely appeals to consistency, which seems the most basic form of an external standard. If he is rejecting the project of rational justification entirely, then one wishes he would say so forthrightly and confront the implications of his view. This much is clear: Hinde’s rejection of rational justification doesn’t keep him from moralizing, or from criticizing certain established moral codes: primarily those of Western societies. We are given no reason to conclude that his antipathy to liberalism is supposed to follow from his “scientific” approach, however, rather than simply being an expression of his own ideology, which presumably cannot be rationally justified—or, at any rate, is not.
What about those pan-cultural principles that are supposed to help us meet some of the difficulties posed by conflict between cultures, and within multicultural societies? Hinde’s argument goes something like this. Morality stems ultimately from certain universals in human nature, as shaped by “natural and cultural selection in interaction with the physical, biological and social environments that humans have experienced in evolutionary and historical time” (13). This welter of influences has produced certain pan-cultural psychological characteristics, which in turn support a few very general but universal moral principles. Of course, there is great disparity among the more specific “moral precepts” of cultures, which together comprise a society’s moral code. Hinde’s primary example of a pan-cultural moral principle is the Golden Rule, “Do as you would be done by.” He is sketchy about the other basic principles but also mentions: “Parents should look after their children”; “Look after your own interests, even at the expense of others”; and “Be loyal to the group.” There are several difficulties here, beginning with the fact that these principles are in deep and obvious tension.
The fundamental defect of Hinde’s approach is evident in this catalogue of putatively universal moral principles. He is not so crude as to claim that any precept based on a pan-cultural principle is thereby justified. This is for the best, since “Be loyal to the group” seems in some contexts to support “Kill all heretics.” By positing several conflicting principles, though, Hinde can always use one or another to give an ad hoc justification or criticism of any precept. The norm about killing heretics might be undermined by the Golden Rule, for instance—except that it usually isn’t. Suppose my religious beliefs call for the killing of blasphemers, and that I hold this norm consistently rather than making an exception for myself. I thus want it to be the case that, were I to blaspheme, I would be killed. Then the Golden Rule seems to imply that that I ought to kill blasphemers. This is problematic. But the deeper problem is with Hinde’s methodology rather than the specific principles he adduces. Since his axioms are contradictory, one or another can be used to justify or criticize any moral precept at all, and Hinde wields them capriciously to derive whatever result he likes.
Moreover, it’s hard to find a straightforward explanation of why the ubiquity of a moral principle is supposed to be justifying. Hinde writes:
A similar sentiment [to the Golden Rule] is to be found in the moral codes of many religions. It is morally correct to promote the welfare of others, using how you would desire to be treated as a guide to what they would like, and to do so not just because you hope that they will pay you back. (77)
But is the second quoted sentence a description (of the “sentiment” held by many or all religions) or a prescription (of what is morally correct)? The reader will find little direct evidence one way or another, but Hinde ultimately seems to suggest that the justifiable principle is something else entirely.
While the principle of Do-as-you-would-be-done-by is (probably) ubiquitous, how people would like to be treated differs between cultures. Indeed it differs even between individuals, so perhaps even the Golden Rule should be rephrased as Do-to-others-as-you-think-they-would-like-to-be-done-by. (191)
However, this “rephrasing” changes the content of the principle without improving it. While the revised version avoids the problem about blasphemy, it runs into other obvious difficulties. Hinde thus has to qualify his revised principle by noting that “even this modified Golden Rule must be tailored to the interests of society: one cannot treat the psychopathic killer as he would like to be treated, with disregard to the societal consequences” (192). The discussion ends here, with the observation that “problems will always remain.” Indeed.
Hinde’s account of the origins of morality also disappoints. It is based on a simplistic and poorly defined dichotomy between two psychological propensities: what he calls “prosocial” and “selfishly assertive” behavior. The concept of prosocial behavior is used very broadly, “to cover diverse types of behavior with the common characteristic that they foster the well-being of others” (28). Selfishly assertive actions are those “that promote one’s self-interest without regard for the interests of others” (28). While Hinde recognizes that these categories “are not necessarily opposed,” he claims “for the most part, prosocial and selfishly assertive tendencies act in opposition, and there is a whole range of behaviors intermediate between them” (29). Yet the concept of prosocial behavior is left extremely vague. It is never explained whose well-being such behavior must promote, only that prosocial behavior involves some kind of regard for others. Are acts of aggression intended to promote the interests of one’s family, tribe, or nation (and hence not just oneself) thereby prosocial? Note that we cannot assume this is an “intermediate” action, since it might be done at great cost to the agent, in which case it can hardly be considered selfish. Hinde fails to consider such questions, which jeopardize his advocacy of the prosocial.
Despite his slipperiness, Hinde clearly has a substantive and thinly veiled moral agenda, evident in statements like this one: “Western and North American societies are biased toward individualism…[while] in East Asian societies there tends to be more conformity to group norms and other characteristics of collectivism” (31). Note the wordage: Western societies are biased; Eastern societies have tendencies. Similarly, we are told
members of generally individualistic societies tend to disapprove of social restrictions in generally collectivist ones, and members of the latter sometimes tend to disapprove of the social irresponsibility of members of generally individualistic ones. (161)
Individualistic societies are socially irresponsible, whereas collectivist societies place social restrictions on their members. Presumably a list of generally collectivist societies of the past century includes the Soviet Union, Maoist China, Saudi Arabia, and the Third Reich. It’s hard to deny that most members of Western societies disapprove of the social restrictions in these collectivist societies—though there are some notable exceptions, especially among contemporary Western academics. One wishes Hinde were more forthright about his own views here. Does he really mean to imply that collectivist societies like these are more socially responsible than individualistic societies? Sadly, we are left to draw our own conclusions. There are clues to be found, though, for instance in Hinde’s brief but unmistakable apologetic for what he refers to as the “genital modification” of girls and women. Despite certain adverse medical consequences (which he suggests may be exaggerated), Hinde notes that “for those involved, genital modification is usually seen as a means of acquiring adult status and full access to group customs, law and religion, and thus as an important part of their cultural heritage” (108). This appeal to the beliefs of “those involved” suggests that the practice is justified by their consent. But why should it matter if an uneducated pre-pubescent girl thinks of her socially coerced mutilation as an important part of her cultural heritage? Isn’t it also part of that heritage to consider the girl’s preferences to be irrelevant to the justification of the practice? It would be enlightening to be given evidence that informed consent is part of the traditional protocol for clitoridectomy. This bizarre argument would never be taken seriously if applied in a Western context, where consent does matter, since the girl obviously lacks the prerequisites for it. Indeed, one is more likely to be told by post-colonialist academics that even educated and adult Western women are so indoctrinated by advertising and the mass media that their desires are the product of false consciousness and need not be respected.
This passage illustrates the great irony of the illiberal ideology animating this book. While philosophers quarrel over the autonomy of ethics from other disciplines, anthropologists and many other academics have long since graduated from the task of description into overly political advocacy. And their ideology, like Hinde’s, tends to be manifested in an incoherent mix of cultural relativism and absolutist multicultural moralizing, on which view the great vice is to be like the colonialists and missionaries, and the great sin is cultural eradication. (Though the eradication of the culture of the Jim Crow South, for instance, is seldom mourned.) Many of these illiberal arguments, like Hinde’s defense of clitoridectomy, are framed in terms of such basic liberal concepts as consent and rights, which are alternately rejected and misapplied. Obviously, I am painting with a broad brush here; but it isn’t hard to show that Hinde fundamentally misunderstands liberalism.
Consider his discussion of rights, which is similarly confused. “Some philosophers (e.g. Bentham) have held that no rights exist unless they are encapsulated in the law,” he writes. “But if the law were the ultimate determiner of individuals’ rights, then there could be no moral objection to a government introducing laws to restrict individual freedoms in any way it wished” (99-100). This is simply a conflation of the notion of rights with that of rightness. And the bit about natural rights being nonsense on stilts seems to be all Hinde knows of Bentham. Of course, as a utilitarian and Philosophic Radical (or classical liberal), Bentham had no difficulty whatsoever making moral objections to various ways in which laws restrict individual freedom. Indeed, he considered most such laws to be unjustified impediments to human flourishing. It would be difficult to read Bentham without absorbing this point; so it isn’t surprising that he doesn’t appear in the bibliography. To judge from that, Hinde seems to have picked up what little moral or political philosophy he knows from reading Mary Warnock’s An Intelligent Person’s Guide to Ethics. Only a handful of other philosophers make the bibliography (though Peter Strawson has the distinction of appearing twice, as both P. and P. F. Strawson). Finally, my edition of Why Good is Good has the worst printing error I’ve ever seen: Routledge has managed to elide pages 115-146, some two chapters, and repeat pages 83-114 in their place.