Why Inequality Matters: Luck Egalitarianism, Its Meaning and Value

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Shlomi Segall, Why Inequality Matters: Luck Egalitarianism, Its Meaning and Value, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 256pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107129818.

Reviewed by Alex Voorhoeve, London School of Economics


Shlomi Segall's new book contains many novel ideas. It should engage researchers with an interest in debates between luck egalitarians and two of their principal opponents, prioritarians and sufficientarians.[1] While, as I shall argue below, not all of its arguments succeed, it also makes contributions which deserve to profoundly influence debates on distributive justice. I will first summarize the book's central points and then evaluate some of its arguments.

Segall's project is to offer a theory of the value of a distribution of well-being. This theory is meant to establish what decision-makers should do insofar as their proper aim is to maximize this value (or to maximize expected value, if they are deciding under risk). It therefore sets aside non-consequentialist concerns such as people's rights and obligations. It also sets aside social egalitarian concerns with the nature of people's relationships. This singular focus on the goodness of distributions allows Segall to make substantial progress on some thorny issues. But it also means that the theory offered can be only one part of a full theory of justice.

In Parts I and III, Segall develops the following central theses about equality. Inequalities in how well people's lives go are intrinsically bad both: (a) when these inequalities are not due to people's choices; and (b) when they are due to choices that it would not have been reasonable to expect them to avoid. Equalities, by contrast, are never bad, even between people who have made very different choices. The badness of inequality, he argues, is not merely impersonal -- it is also bad for a person (albeit in a non-well-being affecting way) to be unfairly less well off than others. Furthermore, while inequalities in final well-being (also known as "ex post" inequalities) are bad, inequalities in expected well-being (also known as "ex ante" inequalities) are not.

In Part II, Segall discusses rivals to egalitarianism. His arguments against sufficientarianism and ex post prioritarianism draw on an example of a kind proposed in Otsuka and Voorhoeve (2009). Suppose a ten-year-old child, Ann, will have just a tolerable quality of life unless we assist her in one of two ways. Action A will improve her quality of life to the point at which it meets the standard of sufficiency. Action B is riskier: it will either leave her with a tolerable quality of life or with a truly excellent life, with either outcome being equally likely. Also suppose that the potential upside of B is just large enough that, considering only Ann's possible fates in isolation from how anyone else fares, one ought to prefer B on Ann's behalf. Following a standard (Von Neumann-Morgenstern) measure of well-being, we can then say that the move from a merely tolerable to a "good enough" life involves a marginally smaller incremental improvement in well-being than the move from this good-enough life to a truly excellent life. Equivalently, we can say that B offers Ann somewhat higher expected well-being. What would it be best for us to choose?

In cases of this kind, Otsuka and I have argued that, if we consider only Ann's fate, we have no grounds for departing from what we have most reason to choose on her behalf (see, e.g., Otsuka 2015). The best course of action is therefore B. Since we are considering Ann's situation in isolation from how others fare, egalitarians will see no reason to disagree. (Indeed, a pluralist egalitarian who cares about improving people's prospects as well as reducing inequality will recommend B.) Sufficientarians and ex post prioritarians, however, must demur. For sufficientarians, ensuring that Ann has a good enough life has special value; this makes A the more valuable prospect. Meanwhile, ex post prioritarians will favor A, because the gain in well-being from the tolerable life to the good-enough life is morally more valuable than the gain in well-being from the good-enough life to the excellent life. Segall points out that both these views must therefore hold that while B has greater prospective personal value for Ann, it has lesser prospective impersonal value. To put it in Sidgwickian terms: sufficientarianism and prioritarianism must hold that "from the point of view of the universe" -- although not from the point of view of Ann's interests -- it is more important to avoid a merely tolerable life for Ann than to give her a shot at an excellent life.

Segall leverages this result in two innovative ways. The first concerns a favorite argument against egalitarianism, the leveling-down objection. (This runs as follows: egalitarianism implies that a diminution in the well-being of the better off that benefits no one but reduces inequality is good in one respect; but such "levelling down" is not good in any respect; therefore, egalitarianism is false.) Segall argues that sufficientarians and prioritarians are not in a position to wield this argument, since they are committed to something very similar: the claim that prospect A is better than B in at least one respect even though it is prospectively better for no one.

Segall's second novel contribution is to carefully examine whether the views in question can offer a plausible account of the impersonal value that, by their lights, can conflict with a person's well-being. What, he asks, is impersonally valuable about achieving sufficiency (or about improving well-being from a lower level)? In the case of sufficiency his answer is: nothing. Sufficientarianism, he concludes, is groundless (pp. 144-5). In the case of priority, however, Segall is prepared to extend an olive twig to his disarmed opponent: he grants that there is impersonal value in improving a person's lot from a lower level of well-being (p. 162). However, contrary to leading prioritarians such as Matthew Adler (Adler 2012), Segall argues that this impersonal value has nothing to do with improving lifetime well-being from a lower level; instead, special prioritarian value inheres only in improvements to those whose well-being is currently low, e.g., because they are in pain (chapter 7).

In my view, two of the most important ideas in the book are Segall's move to strip sufficientarians and prioritarians of the levelling-down objection and his interrogation of distributive views that recommend actions that are to no one's prospective advantage. However, while the former is exceptionally well executed (pp. 164-77 are a highlight), I was not persuaded that we ought to embrace "time-slice" prioritarianism. To bolster this view, Segall (pp. 199-201) argues that we have special reason to alleviate pain, even if the sufferer has a good life overall. But this reason does not, in fact, support time-slice prioritarianism. For this form of prioritarianism is indifferent to whether improvements in well-being result from the alleviation of suffering or instead from the receipt of some other benefit. Moreover, this form of prioritarianism must hold that it is more important to give a benefit of a given size to someone who is now moderately well off rather than to someone who is now extremely well off, even when neither is suffering. And that conclusion cannot be justified with an appeal to the special importance of alleviating pain.

Segall's other important ideas concern equality. One is that while unequal well-being that does not result from people's choices from equal opportunity sets is always bad, equal well-being is never bad. He therefore rejects the idea, sometimes attributed to luck egalitarians, that equality itself demands that people should bear the costs of their choices. Now, I agree with Segall that a basic egalitarian premise should be understood simply as the claim that inequalities that arise from unequal opportunity sets are unfair. I also agree that this premise implies nothing about inequalities that result from people's choices from equal opportunity sets. Importantly, this means that egalitarians can, without compromising this core commitment, adopt any of a wide variety of what we might call "principles of responsibility" to decide which, if any, inequalities due to choices from equal opportunity sets they should countenance. This idea has been emphasized by several authors, including Segall in previous work (Segall 2010, pp. 78-80; see also Olsaretti 2009).

In this book, Segall contributes to this project by arguing persuasively that egalitarians should also object to inequalities that are due to choices that we could not reasonably expect individuals to avoid (such as clearly advantageous gambles, pp. 237-40). But his claim that an egalitarian should find nothing objectionable in any equality of condition goes further. For Segall finds nothing objectionable in a case in which Andrew has far superior opportunities to Carolyn, but makes poor use of these opportunities and ends up as well off as Carolyn (pp. 82-3). However, it seems to me that an egalitarian should find something to object to in this case. Carolyn can rightly claim that it is unfair that she never had the opportunities that Andrew had. This inequality in the distribution of initial opportunities is not, I submit, rendered irrelevant merely because she happens to end up no worse off than Andrew. Egalitarians, I conclude, should object not merely to inequalities in well-being that result from unequal opportunities, but also to unequal opportunities themselves, even when they do not lead to inequalities in well-being.

I was also unpersuaded by Segall's argument that chances are of no consequence for distributive justice. Unfortunately, the way he introduces the topic is not ideal. In an attempt to illustrate the "clash" between equal chances and equal outcomes, he asks: "Is it better  . . . that one individual dies prematurely (say, at 40 years) and the other lives till 80 years, while [each has] an equal chance to be [in] one or the other [position], or is it better that they both live, with certainty, to 55 years?" (p. 19). But, of course, in this case, individuals have equal chances either way; so chance equality does not speak in favor (or against) either scenario, while outcome equality favors the latter. The following case (adapted from p. 219) better illustrates the intended contrast. Suppose Gina and Helen will both die at 40 without treatment. One can either extend Gina's life to 79 and Helen's to 41 or instead toss a fair coin for a treatment that leaves the winner with 80 years and the loser with 40. It seems to me clear that the latter is fairer because it gives each at least something of equal value -- namely, their prospects at the moment of decision -- and thereby recognizes their equal claims to the good. Following Broome (1990), I would also say that this equalization of prospects makes the eventual outcome of the coin toss fairer than the outcome of giving it to Gina outright, despite the fact that the latter contains less inequality in final well-being.

Segall offers an alternative explanation of the judgment that we should flip a coin in this case, namely that this is a way of avoiding partiality towards Gina or Helen (p. 221). I do not think this explanation succeeds. For, in this case, choosing the coin flip would not demonstrate such impartiality, since it would also be one's preferred option if one were biased towards Helen.

Segall also directly attacks the idea that chances contribute to fairness. He argues that since both the winner and the loser of the coin toss have been given something of the same prospective value, the toss cannot be said to compensate for the resulting inequality in final well-being (p. 218). But this observation does not threaten a view on which fairness is determined by inequality in the distributions of two goods: expected well-being and final well-being. And since the coin toss generates far less inequality in the first of these goods, it may be fairer despite the fact that it generates marginally greater inequality in the second of these goods. To give an analogy: if both the distribution of apples (expected well-being) and the distribution of oranges (final well-being) matters for fairness, then the overall distribution in which Gina gets 79 apples and 79 oranges and Helen gets 41 apples and 41 oranges can be less fair than one in which Gina and Helen each get 60 apples and one of them gets 80 oranges and the other 40 oranges.

These points of disagreement notwithstanding, I can wholeheartedly recommend this book to scholars of distributive justice. In my view, it conclusively establishes that alongside egalitarians, prioritarians and sufficientarians must sometimes regard a prospect as better (in at least one respect) when it is not better (in terms of well-being) for anyone. Sufficientarians and prioritarians must therefore relinquish a treasured anti-egalitarian argument. It also makes a powerful case that among these three views, egalitarians are in the best position to explain such departures from what is in each person's prudential interest. For egalitarians can point to the natural idea that it is unfair when, due to pure chance, some fare much better than others. By contrast, it remains unclear what value, if any, sufficientarians or prioritarians can appeal to in order to justify their departures from what best promotes people's well-being.


Adler, M. (2012). Well-Being and Fair Distribution. Oxford University Press.

Broome, J. (1990). "Fairness," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 91: 87-101.

Olsaretti, S. (2009). "Responsibility and the Consequences of Choice," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society CIX, Part 2: 165-88.

Otsuka, M. (2015). "Prioritarianism and the Measure of Utility," Journal of Political Philosophy 23: 1-22.

Otsuka, M. and A. Voorhoeve (2009). "Why It Matters that Some Are Worse Off than Others: An Argument against the Priority View," Philosophy and Public Affairs 37: 171-199.

Segall, S. (2010). Health, Luck and Justice. Princeton University Press.

[1] Roughly, prioritarianism holds that: (i) an increment of well-being has more moral value, the lower the level of well-being from which this increment takes place, and (ii) the value of an increment of well-being depends only on the absolute level of well-being to which it is added, and not on others' levels of well-being. Sufficientarianism holds that it is especially important that people have enough to lead a good life, and that inequalities in well-being in themselves do not matter.