Why Law Matters

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Alon Harel, Why Law Matters, Oxford University Press, 2014, 240pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780198766216.

Reviewed by Barbara Baum Levenbook, North Carolina State University


Alon Harel's general purpose, as he sees it, is to offer a non-instrumentalist justification for certain political and legal institutions that "echo[es] the sentiments and passions of those who support, sustain, and even challenge [them]" (p. 225). These institutions are the institutions of legal rights, legal punishment by the state, constitutional directives, and judicial review. These institutions aren't merely justified contingently, according to Harel, even when an instrumentalist justification works for them. The institutions are intrinsically valuable, being necessary to a just society (p. 3). They are "necessary for the realization of certain values." (p. 225) So they "matter as such," and law matters as such.

It's an ambitious project, for which Harel offers long chains of argumentation. Along the way, he presents us with intriguing claims: values are partially constructed by (legal) rights (p. 6), the value of some goods (he claims legal punishment is one of them) depends on their being provided by the right agent, constitutional entrenchment of rights constitutes (valuable) public recognition of a duty binding the state (in particular, the legislature, p. 7), sometimes democracy undermines legitimacy (p. 141), and the value of judicial review is its realization of a moral right to a hearing that rights-holders have when the issue is whether their right is justifiably violated and also when the issue is whether or not they have the right they claim.

In the end, he doesn't quite pull his non-instrumentalist project off. On the other hand, there are valuable achievements in the book, among them:

  • a good argument that the classification of a demand for protection of an activity as a right depends on the reasons grounding the demand.
  • a good argument against what he calls the primacy of value thesis for rights, which is the thesis that "values underlying rights are normatively prior to rights, and that values dictate . . . the scope and strength of rights." (p. 13)
  • establishing that some acts are "agent-dependent," in that they must be done by only certain sorts of agents.

One of the difficulties with the book can be found in Harel's discussion of legal rights in Part I, during which he rejects the primacy of value thesis (for failure to solve certain "puzzles" about reasons, rights, and the scope of activities to be protected). The problem is that Harel's development of his solution to these puzzles and his argument for it fails to achieve his declared general purpose. He starts with Joseph Raz's view that certain social practices are needed to create access to values. He then claims that the institution of some legal rights, such as the right to free speech, creates (some) access to autonomy (and also dignity). Let us set aside the question of whether autonomy has intrinsic value. Suppose it does and suppose, though Harel nowhere makes this claim, that the more realization of autonomy there is in a society, the closer it is to a just society, ceteris paribus. (There would have to be a great deal covered by "ceteris paribus," including protection against being harmed by others against one's will plus some distribution principle for autonomy in order for this claim to be plausible.)

Harel spends time making plausible the claim that entrenched legal rights (and their attendant litigation) can help, under some conditions, to create a culture that recognizes and values autonomous choices; but he spends no time establishing that entrenched legal rights are necessary for such a culture or indispensable no matter the culture. On the latter points, he merely helps himself to a number of unsubstantiated and controversial empirical claims.

No one denies that laws can create occasions for autonomy (or activities in which autonomy can be exercised, such as in the forming of a corporation). But this is a consequence of particular laws, not of entrenched rights. Moreover, a justification based on increasing conditions for autonomy is instrumentalist. A plausible justification for entrenching some legal rights that has something to do with autonomy but that is independent of the consequences of laws establishing entrenched legal rights is difficult, if not impossible, to tease out of Harel's text. Insofar as he means to claim that people become educated and sensitized to occasions for exercising autonomy through the establishment of some legal rights, he is making an empirical and contingent claim, unsupported by evidence across all cultures. Insofar as he assumes that there is no way to teach which activities are autonomy-enhancing except by entrenching legal rights (p. 47) , he makes a claim that is once again empirical and contingent (on alleged human limitations) but for which there is no argument and no evidence adduced. As a claim about all societies, it is flatly implausible. Further, the obvious justification based on this claim is again instrumentalist. So perhaps he means that there is something about establishing a legal right to certain activities that noncontingently publicly acknowledges (p. 42) or signals (p. 17) those activities as autonomy occasions, whether or not people get the message. However, this claim is unconvincing. Moreover, it is mysterious how an ineffective signaling could be necessary to a just society. Perhaps what does the signaling is the rationale used to establish these legal rights; Harel insists that rights must be protected "for the sake of promoting autonomy" (p. 47). But what constitutes a state protecting rights for the sake of autonomy is left unspecified. Further, it is entirely contingent whether the rationale gets communicated to the people who supposedly benefit by being sensitized to a specific activity in which they can exercise their autonomy.

I don't want to imply that there is no merit in Harel's discussion of certain legal rights in Part I. Though he overstates his case ("In the absence of legal entrenchment of rights and their salience in the public sphere, the values underlying the rights could not even in principle be realized" p. 47), Harel does give us reasons to believe that sometimes, the proposal to substitute a general protection of autonomy for specific legal rights will result in a significant loss in people's actually exercising autonomy when compared to a legal system in which narrow activities are protected as a legal right, there is litigation of the right and a lively public discussion of the connection between that right and exercising autonomy. So sometimes, having certain legal rights has just as much normative priority as the value, autonomy, they help to serve.

Harel does produce a non-instrumentalist argument against privatization of punishment in Part II of the book. The conclusion is that the "good" of punishment cannot for conceptual reasons be delivered by anyone but a public official. The connection to justice Harel sees here seems to be through the concept of treating the punished person with dignity. The beginning of the argument may be reconstructed as follows:

  1. Dignity (of the punished) requires that decisions (in all details of their punishment) be made for certain reasons only, and in particular, from "respectful deliberation."
  2. Respectful deliberation requires that the deliberator have the right status to make the decisions and take the acts.
  3. Punishment requires an authoritative judgment of wrongdoing.
  4. Authoritative judgments of wrongdoing must (to be authoritative?) come from someone with the legitimate power to make those judgments.
  5. Only the state has the legitimate power to make those judgments (if the state has legitimate power at all?).
  6. Hence, the authoritative judgment in question on every aspect of punishing must be attributable to the state.
  7. A decision is attributable to the state if and only if the decider defers to the state in reasoning.

The argument so far may be challenged. For example, the fifth premise is question-begging. Why not say "only the state and its duly appointed contractors have the legitimate power . . . ."? To the rhetorical question Harel poses, "Who am I to decide or act in the first place?" (p. 51), the obvious answer, for the private contractor, is, "I am the one the state entrusted though a contract (and is paying) to carry out the court-mandated punishment." Leaving out the phrase "and its duly appointed contractors" biases the argument. Harel cannot support this move with his claim that an authoritative judgment of wrongdoing must come from an agent "superior" to the punished person (p. 53). In a footnote (to p. 53), Harel suggests that the superiority in question is legitimacy of the use of power; but if this is the case, he will at this point have begged the question in assuming that a private contractor doesn't exercise legitimate power.

The weakest part of the argument is what comes next. Harel relies on three key premises: (8) a public official is one who defers to the state in reasoning, (9) deference to the state requires participation in "integrative practices," practices "that integrate the political and the bureaucratic" (p. 67), and (10) integrative practices are open to "ongoing political guidance and intervention" (p. 8) in a way in which being given some discretion under contract to the government is not. Premise (8) is an odd choice, oddly put. The language suggests that there is heteronomy, not autonomy, on the part of public officials; but in spite of language suggesting this view (public officials deliberate "in a way that is attentive and even deferential to political leaders and representatives," [p. 67] -- which, by the way, would not apply to U.S. Supreme Court justices), this is not what Harel means. Indeed, it becomes clear there need not be much deference at all once the burden of premises (9) and (10) is explained.

It is because of that explanation that Harel's argument fails. The explanation can be put thus: In spite of Harel's claim that "underspecified tasks" with "broad discretion" are inconsistent with an integrative practice (p. 87), he admits that in both public and private prisons, the politicians will have delegated authority to make minute daily decisions to the one who "executes" the punishment (pp. 92-93). His suggestion is that an integrative practice requires two things. The first is that the carrying out of the discretion granted must take place in a "coordinative effort" to form a "shared perspective," and he gives as an example one public official responding to and taking into account how her fellow officials have made discretionary decisions on some matter (p. 89). I doubt this description is true of all discretionary decisions by public prison wardens in their daily decisions about the treatment of specific inmates; so this condition for an integrative practice seems implausible, but this is a minor quibble. Harel goes on to admit that private individuals can form such a practice (p. 90). He therefore adds the second condition: the integrative practice must be open to political intervention by "engaging . . . politicians." However, being open to political intervention turns out to be being liable, politically and, I suppose, legally, to politically- and legally-imposed further limitations on one's discretion (at every turn, apparently) plus being willing to be so "guided" (pp. 67, 92, 93). (Once more, this is not true of U.S. Supreme Court justices.)

This idea is too weak to do the job of distinguishing the public official's alleged deference to the state from the private contractor's alleged lack of deference. Being liable to political intervention at every turn is compatible with having the probability of intervention so close to zero that for all practical purposes the public official has a great deal of discretion in carrying out a sentence, as Harel is aware. The engagement of political officials at this point may be entirely theoretical across a vast area of delegated authority. Moreover, the actions not intervened with may not be known by political officials. That puts Harel in worse shape in attaching a decision of the state to a lesser official's action than Austin is with his idea of the sovereign's tacit consent. Why, in such a case, should we imagine that the warden's decision to place a prisoner in solitary or to deprive him of some prison privileges, or instead to extend some, is any more the state's than a private contractor's would be? By what alchemy can a theoretical role for (other) state actors make the warden's decision, untouched by them, deference to their reasoning, or a decision of the state? That I have the moral legitimacy to intervene by micromanagement in the way my teenage son drives to the store to buy us some groceries does not make his decision (unanticipated by me) to turn a corner on two wheels, or to risk running a red light on the way, my decision. Still less does it show that in that action, my son is deferring to my reasoning.

So Harel's conceptual argument that the good of punishment cannot be delivered except by a public official is unsuccessful. One might also add that there are circumstances where a private contractor can be explicitly liable to political intervention at every turn: if the contract explicitly holds him open to whatever future further requirements or restrictions a political body cares to impose. If I understand him correctly, Harel would proclaim such a contractor a public official (pp. 67, 93, 94). This move weakens the appeal of his thesis about privatization since some privatization would be justifiable, in his view. One must just write the contract correctly.

Once more, I do not wish to imply that there is no merit in Harel's attempt to provide a non-instrumentalist case against the privatization of punishment. I am sympathetic to the view that privatization of prisons, for example, is morally objectionable, ceteris paribus; and I suspect Harel is right to add, "but not for instrumentalist reasons (alone)." He just hasn't found the correct non-instrumentalist case, nor the correct analysis of being an agent of the state. Perhaps the non-instrumentalist case does not hinge on whether or not the executor of punishment is the state's agent.

In the interests of space, I must pass over other interesting discussions in Harel's book, including his discussion of war as an intrinsically public good; his argument that some acts of killing or letting die in emergencies (such as ordering the shooting down of a commercial liner hijacked by terrorists) may only properly be done by persons acting privately, whatever their official role may be; and the entire third part of the book, which contains Harel's defense of what he calls "robust constitutionalism," including a defense of judicial review. This is no reflection on the importance of the topics or of Harel's arguments. Fine discussions of Harel's views on robust constitutionalism have appeared elsewhere.

In spite of its flaws, this is a book that will interest legal and political philosophers who explore the issues Harel addresses. Its rich, detailed, intricate and novel argumentation ought to appeal to those with strong deontological intuitions and, no doubt, will stimulate the development of philosophical thought both sympathetic to and antithetical to Harel's conclusions.