Why Philosophize?

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Jean-François Lyotard, Why Philosophize?, Andrew Brown (tr.), Polity, 2013, 123pp., $12.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745670737.

Reviewed by Karin Fry, University of Wisconsin, Stevens Point


This is an English translation of a series of lectures that Jean-François Lyotard gave to undergraduate students at the Sorbonne in the autumn of 1964. The typed manuscript containing them and Lyotard's corrections had been lying in a French library and was not published in French until 2012. Why Philosophize? is a very early work, prior to Lyotard's major writings. It is also a bit more accessible than his other writings, since the audience was undergraduates. The topic continues to be timely, as it explores the reason for doing philosophy, particularly in a world in which it is misunderstood and largely unappreciated.

There are four lectures. The first connects the source of philosophy to the desire for unity, which stems from its lack. Lyotard discusses how desire emerges within a relationship of presence and absence, and stems from seeking something that is absent and yearning for it. He applies this idea to a social and political context and argues that philosophy emerges in society when it loses meaning and fails to provide a unified and coherent picture of reality. This gives way to a discussion of desire, particularly in Plato's Symposium, in which Alcibiades is willing to give his beauty to Socrates in exchange for Socrates' wisdom. Socrates is skeptical of the exchange, since he has no wisdom to offer, and he realizes that wisdom cannot be an object of exchange on the market. The philosopher is one who notes that "To philosophize is not to desire wisdom, it is to desire desire," since attaining all the answers and satisfying this desire are not possible (38). The desire for wisdom runs through all of philosophy, and philosophy is in the unusual position in that it can reflect upon its desire while having it.

Lyotard's second lecture focuses on the question of origin. After discussing Hegel's and Heraclitus' philosophies, he concludes that philosophy arises due to a lack of unity and lack of meaning, but this lack has always been present. The philosopher mourns the lack of unity, but it is not as though this problem points to a time before that contained wholeness. As such, the origin of philosophy is not a historical question, since going back to the ancient Greeks in order to seek an origin of philosophy misses that the origin is still with us, which is the lack and desire for the lost object. So, the origin or motive for philosophy exists in 1964 as well as today.

The third lecture is the longest and focuses on philosophical speech. Philosophy occurs through speech, but Lyotard rejects a more typical view of language in which the subject and object are sharply divided. A strong subject/object dichotomy suggests that either the subject is in complete control of the decisions regarding speech and in charge of it, or that the world inspires the speaker like a direct muse that works through the speaker. According to Lyotard, both the words and the meaning (the signifier and signified) are birthed through the act of speech. Speech requires effort, since the meaning of the world is not obvious, but the speaker is not in complete control, since speech is in relationship with meaning derived from the world.

Philosophical speech is a special type of speech that arises when the world no longer seems to make sense or speaks to us (89). It is partly dependent on listening to what is other and seeking what has not yet been said. Philosophical language does not merely report or observe, but it creates expressions of what is new by grasping something latent in the world. Unlike other kinds of discourses, philosophy is more self-reflective and knows that it cannot possess itself (94). Rather than taking a "side" in the subject/object dichotomy, philosophy is on the "side" of signifier and of the signified at the same time.

As Lyotard describes it, philosophical speech says too much and too little at the same time. It says too little by not attaining its goal of a unified truth because the discourse is always unfinished, and the discourse itself is not self-sufficient but presupposes a type of circularity. But it says too much by using language that carries more meanings that are below the surface, much like poetic language (96-97). For Lyotard, philosophical speech aims at truth, yet misses it because conclusive answers to everything cannot be attained, even though it continues to achieve a kind of truth of a kind (97). His discussion of language is clearly within a psychoanalytic model, since the desire of the absent that is revealed through philosophical discourse mimics the law of language in general, and how it arises through lack. Lyotard describes the fact that philosophy cannot answer every question by stating "for the child, too, there comes a time when the mother can no longer be the answer to everything" (96).

Just when all hope seems to be lost for philosophy attaining a meaningful purpose, since what is articulated through it is not a systematic understanding of the world, Lyotard's fourth and final lecture comments on the connection between philosophy and action, and ultimately the significance of philosophizing. Since he already asserted that philosophical speech cannot obtain its goal of providing unity and total understanding of the world, which is a fantasy, it looks as though there is limited use to philosophy. Lyotard notes that unlike in 399 B.C.E. Athens, one no longer needs to make the philosopher drink hemlock to underscore philosophy's uselessness, but this "killing" can occur in contemporary times by making philosophizing seem irrelevant and restricting the audience (102).

Lyotard examines Marx's assertion that the point of philosophy is not to theorize about the world, but to change it. For Lyotard, the purpose of philosophy is to articulate the real problems that exist, but have not yet been articulated. Philosophy will not satisfy desire or provide unity, but any political transformation of reality requires theory. Typical politicians who seek to attain goals are not necessarily more successful at changing reality than philosophers, because they often maintain the status quo. True transformation seeks to destroy false conscience, and articulates something in the present that beckons the future (111-12). Lyotard is adamant that the philosopher is not articulating a pre-determined law of history, but articulating a transformation of the world that has already occurred and needs speech (112, 116). The meaning must be articulated in speech so that one may act, and Lyotard claims that transformative action cannot occur without theory that reflects the lack of meaning within society (113, 120). He states, "only if reality comes to thought, if the world comes to speech, can thought and speech be true" (114).

Philosophy struggles to bring the signified and signifier together and tries to avoid falling into the trap of what has already been thought (121). Philosophy cannot produce results or a system of thought that unifies and orders everything, but it witnesses the lack of unity and names it. Philosophy is unavoidable, since even efforts to remain ignorant and reject philosophical thinking are still haunted by its problems (123). Lyotard concludes with the question "In truth, how can we not philosophize?" (123). For Lyotard, "you can transform this world only by listening to it" (122).

Within the lectures there are interesting commentaries on Freud, Hegel, Marx, Socrates, Descartes, Saussure, and many others that enrich and give insight into Lyotard's other works. There are also literary references to figures like Keats and Camus, as well as interesting comments about topics like Christianity and aesthetic theory. Throughout, there is amazing use of poetic metaphors to explain intellectual concepts, such as describing the situation between Alcibiades and Socrates as "not a cash market, but a credit market in which the debtor -- here, Socrates -- is not sure of being creditworthy" (33). Likewise, describing the fact that if philosophical language were merely a matter of individual choice and whim, it would be as "empty as an auditorium before the show starts" (95), or as if describing the politician who maintains current power structures as being like a mother that does not want her child to grow into an adult (111). There are also hints at Lyotard's future works, such as when he describes Heraclitus' God as running the world like a game of cards and managing it according to those rules, and describing philosophy as a game of chess or cards, which points toward Just Gaming (53-54, 65). Further, he describes transformative action as asking the question "'This is what's happening, this is where it's going'" (113), which reminds one of the Is it happening? of Le Différend. In general, these lectures are well worth reading and an excellent and enlightening defense of philosophy. Any defense of philosophy that does not use technological rationality or justifies philosophy by giving someone skills to get a job is certainly important as higher education falls more and more into a capitalist business model.

Yet, some questions remain. First, the conclusion amounts to saying that the true value of philosophy is a social and political value in transforming the world and rejecting the possibility of systematizing it. There is no doubt that there are epistemologists, metaphysicians, and ethicists who would take issue with raising the social and political aspect of philosophy above all others. Further, many would argue that some unifying structure is possible to attain, making philosophy more straightforward in its aims. For Lyotard, this is a fantasy that some philosophers have, but they are deluded (98-99). Yet, insisting that there is some political transformation that is occurring and reaching out to the philosopher to name, seems in need of further defense to be absolutely convincing.

Additionally, the lectures contain the problematic use of gendered terms that exist in Lyotard's later works, like The Inhuman, in which rationality is sexed as male, while desire, the unconscious, and bodily drives are sexed as female. The philosopher in the singular is always sexed as male, as is the politician. Furthermore, in Lyotard's discussion of Eros, which is inspired by both Plato and Lacan's work, attraction is linked to virility and masculinity, while repulsion is linked to the feminine (24-25). Life is also connected to masculine virility whereas death is connected to the feminine, but it is unclear whether Lyotard is endorsing these gendered depictions or merely describing Plato and Lacan's views (24-25). Yet, some of Lyotard's metaphors, like when he compares the apparent uselessness of philosophy to "the pastime of a young lady from a good family (since, like her, it produces no supersonic airplanes or because it works in its room and is of interest to almost nobody)" (122) strikes the contemporary reader as unnecessary and gives more evidence for problematic uses of gender in his work as a whole.

All and all, Why Philosophize? provides a good reflection on the reasons for doing philosophy, one which rejects a means/ends approach but sees a value inherent in the activity itself. Lyotard is at once more modest and grander in his aims for philosophy, since many philosophers would reject the idea that coherent understanding of the world is impossible, and yet, would not go so far as to suggest that philosophy can describe unrepresented political criticisms that can transform reality. The book gives insight into Lyotard's motives that led to his later works and suggests intriguing possibilities for the significance of philosophy as a whole. For these reasons, it is important and adds to our understanding of his work in general.