Why Political Liberalism? On John Rawls's Political Turn

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Paul Weithman, Why Political Liberalism? On John Rawls's Political Turn, Oxford University Press, 2010, 379pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195393033.

Reviewed by Blain Neufeld, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


As its title indicates, this book reconstructs the reasons why Rawls thought it necessary to recast his conception of justice, 'justice as fairness,' as a 'political' conception. Weithman rejects the widespread view, which he labels the 'Public Basis View,' that Rawls's move to political liberalism was motivated by dissatisfaction with the justification for justice as fairness advanced in part I of A Theory of Justice (hereinafter 'TJ'). Instead, Weithman accepts Rawls's claim that it was the failure of the account of stabilitypresented in part III of TJ that led him to recast justice as fairness as a political conception. With remarkable clarity and rigor, Weithman explains the problems that Rawls found with that account and the ways in which Political Liberalism (hereinafter 'PL') aspired to overcome them.

This is the best book that I have read on political liberalism. The only substantive concern that I have with Weithman's account has to do with his distinction between two ways of understanding what might be called the 'normative basis' of political liberalism, a 'respect-based' account and a 'conception-based' account, and his endorsement of the latter. Despite this concern, though, I think that the book's main claims not only are convincingly presented, but also are correct. The overall account of political liberalism is an inspirational one.


In chapter I, Weithman presents the 'Public Basis View' (hereinafter 'PBV') of Rawls's move to political liberalism. Very roughly, the PBV construes the principles of justice as serving as (something like) a 'foundation charter' for a just liberal society. The grounds of that charter must be acceptable to all reasonable citizens in order for them to supportfreely the 'basic structure' (the main political and economic institutions) of their society. Such free support is necessary for a society organized by justice as fairness to be a 'well-ordered society.'

Weithman identifies the three central claims of the PBV as follows:

(i) the claim that the argument with which Rawls became dissatisfied was the argument for the principles of justice provided in part I of TJ, (ii) the claim that Rawls became dissatisfied with it because he recognized that it would be too controversial to serve as the shared, public basis of the principles in a pluralistic society, and (iii) the claim that Rawls responded to this difficulty by recasting that defense so that it could be the object of an overlapping consensus. (p. 19)

According to the PBV, then, Rawls hoped that by recasting justice as fairness as a political conception, "as standing free of metaphysical claims about the nature of persons" (p. 30), it could serve as the 'foundation charter' for a society characterized by reasonable pluralism.

Weithman identifies a number of problems with the PBV, the most manifest of which is that it conflicts with Rawls's own explanation of why he judged it necessary to recast justice as fairness as a political conception. Rawls claimed that only by doing so could a society organized in accordance with the principles of justice be stable over time. Weithman's account thus "takes Rawls at his word when he says that the changes between TJ and PL were motivated by problems he found in part III of TJ" (p. 268). Overcoming these problems, though, necessitated recasting the ideas employed in part I of TJ, such as the conception of the person and the original position, as political ideas. Moreover, some new ideas, such as those of 'public reason' and the 'liberal principle of legitimacy,' had to be introduced. Nonetheless, Weithman argues that the explanation for these changes is that Rawls thought that they were necessary in order to replace the account of stability in part III of TJ with an account compatible with the principles of justice -- not, as the PBV maintains, because he became dissatisfied with the justification of those principles in part I of TJ.

What, then, is Rawls's account of stability? In both TJ and PL, Rawls treats the question of stability in two parts. The first part concerns the acquisition of an effective 'sense of justice' among citizens. A society with a basic structure that conforms to the principles of justice as fairness, and in which this fact is public knowledge, is one in which citizens naturally would come to understand, accept, and act from the principles, that is, have an effective sense of justice. This first part of Rawls's account of stability remains largely (though not entirely[1]) unchanged from TJ to PL.

The main reasons for Rawls's move to political liberalism, according to Weithman, can be found in the second part of Rawls's treatment of stability. Here the issue is whether citizens who already possess an effective sense of justice would, upon reflection, rationally choose to maintain that sense as part of their character, rather than, say, modify their character such that they no longer regard compliance with the principles of justice as regulative for their lives. Such a decision is a fundamental one, as it concerns what kind of character to have, and thus what kind of life to live. A society in which citizens would rationally choose to retain their sense of justice is a society that would enjoy what Weithman calls 'inherent stability.'

Inherent stability is difficult to achieve. If citizens believe that other citizens rationally might choose not to regard their sense of justice as authoritative, their own commitment to maintaining their sense of justice would be undermined. This, Weithman explains, is the "generalized prisoner's dilemma" that threatens the inherent stability of a well-ordered society (pp. 47-49). Very roughly, uncertainty concerning the possibility of 'defection' by other citizens (i.e., the possibility that they may decide no longer to regard their sense of justice as authoritative) makes defection the dominant strategy for all rational persons.

A primary task of part III of TJ, then, is to address this threat to inherent stability. Weithman reconstructs Rawls's strategy as proceeding in two parts. First, Rawls attempts to show 'congruence' between citizens' sense of justice and their conceptions of the good. Simplifying greatly, if the good of each person is 'congruent' with their sense of justice, then it would not be rational for them to stop regarding their sense of justice as authoritative.

Weithman devotes chapters IV-VII to reconstructing Rawls's arguments for congruence, the first of which is that all members of a well-ordered society would want to realize, as part of their respective conceptions of the good, certain ideals of friendship, association, and personal conduct. Importantly for the purposes of establishing congruence, they would want to realize these ideals independent of their commitment to the principles of justice, that is, they would want to realize them even when deliberating about whether to retain their sense of justice. The ideals are part of the 'thin theory of the good' advanced in TJ. Weithman explains how citizens' desire to realize these ideals would lead them to decide to retain their sense of justice. He calls his reconstruction of Rawls's argument based on these 'ideal-based desires' the 'Argument from Love and Justice' (chapter VI). In addition, all persons in a well-ordered society would want to realize what Weithman calls an ideal of 'thin autonomy.' Again, persons would want to realize this ideal independent of their commitment to the principles of justice. But they would come to see that realizing this ideal entails endorsement of the principles of justice as regulative for their lives; recognition of this transforms the ideal in question to one of 'full autonomy.' This argument, reconstructed in chapter VII, Weithman calls the 'Kantian Congruence Argument.' The Argument from Love and Justice and the Kantian Congruence Argument make up Rawls's case in favor of congruence in TJ.

The second part of Rawls's overall strategy for establishing the inherent stability of a well-ordered society involves overcoming what Weithman calls the 'mutual assurance problem.' The mutual assurance problem, roughly, is that citizens rationally may choose not to retain their sense of justice if they do not believe that other citizens will do so as well, despite the congruence of their conceptions of the good and their sense of justice. Weithman explains that Rawls held that public knowledge of the fact of congruence, which would exist in a well-ordered society, would be sufficient to overcome the mutual assurance problem. Crudely put, congruence plus publicity yields inherent stability.

What prompted Rawls's move to political liberalism, Weithman explains (primarily in chapter VIII), was his recognition that the account of congruence advanced in TJ failed. The reason that it failed is that the arguments for congruence presuppose that all citizens will come to share the same 'partially comprehensive doctrine.' This partially comprehensive doctrine, very roughly, includes specific ideals of friendship, association, conduct, and 'Kantian' autonomy. This assumption, though, is implausible given the nature of the society shaped by the principles of justice. Rawls came to think that citizens in a well-ordered society -- persons who conceive of themselves as free and equal, and who exercise their practical reason accordingly -- would not converge on the ideals necessary for congruence. Given this feature of a well-ordered society, the 'fact of reasonable pluralism,' Rawls abandoned his account of inherent stability.

Rawls thought that a well-ordered society might nonetheless be 'stable for the right reasons' if justice as fairness could be reformulated as a political conception. Such a conception could serve as the focus of an 'overlapping consensus' among the different comprehensive doctrines endorsed by reasonable persons in a well-ordered society. Simply put, according to Weithman, Rawls replaced TJ's account of congruence with PL's account of an overlapping consensus. Instead of positing that all reasonable persons would share certain 'partially comprehensive' ethical ideals, PL leaves it to citizens to achieve congruence between their comprehensive doctrines and the principles of justice (see pp. 300f., and PL, p. 140). What is important for stability is that an overlapping consensus obtains. Reasonable persons would generally choose to retain their sense of justice for reasons given by their respective comprehensive doctrines.

In chapters IX and X, Weithman explains further that Rawls in PL held that public knowledge of the overlapping consensus, as well as a willingness by citizens to employ 'public reason' when deciding fundamental political questions, would be sufficient to solve the 'mutual assurance problem' that otherwise would undermine citizens' sense of justice (even if all citizens separately supported the principles of justice for reasons shaped by their respective comprehensive doctrines). Consequently, a well-ordered society -- a society with a basic structure organized by the political conception of justice as fairness -- would be 'stable for the right reasons.'


My only significant disagreement with Weithman's account concerns what may be called the 'normative basis' of political liberalism, which is discussed in chapter XI (§§XI.1-3). Weithman criticizes what he calls the 'respect-based' view of the normative basis of political liberalism, and defends instead a 'conception-based' view.

The respect-based view, most famously advanced by Charles Larmore, holds that political liberalism ultimately must rest upon a principle of 'respect for persons.'[2] Since the principles of justice are to be enforced coercively (even in a well-ordered society), the principle of respect for persons requires that those principles of justice be justifiable to the (adequately rational and reasonable) persons subject to them. The principle of respect for persons constitutes, according to Larmore, the 'moral foundation' of liberalism. InPL this requirement is fleshed out by Rawls, on Larmore's reading, as the 'liberal principle of legitimacy' (hereinafter 'LPL'). The LPL is more fundamental than the principles of justice, according to the respect-based view, and only those principles that satisfy the LPL, like those of justice as fairness when formulated as a political conception, can be enforced by coercive political power in a society characterized by reasonable pluralism.

According to Larmore's respect-based understanding of political liberalism, then, Rawls makes a mistake when he notes that the LPL is justified by being selected by the parties in the original position (see PL, p. 255). This is a mistake, according to Larmore, because such a justification would be circular. As an expression of the principle of respect for persons, the LPL imposes conditions on what kinds of principles of justice can be enforced coercively in a pluralist society. The original position models those conditions. Consequently, the LPL itself cannot be justified by the original position (see pp. 349-52, and Larmore (1999), pp. 609-611).

Weithman defends a more modest interpretation of the LPL. The LPL is not meant to shape or constrain the determination of the principles of justice themselves, as the respect-based view holds; rather, the LPL and its associated idea of public reason simply are meant to guide the application of the principles of justice. Consequently, according to Weithman, there is no problem with justifying the LPL in precisely the same way as the principles of justice -- all these principles are justified via the original position.

In place of the respect-based view, Weithman advocates a "conception-based" or "ideal-based" view (§XI.2), according to which the authority of the principles of justice and the LPL is contingent upon the acceptance of a particular conception or ideal of citizens and society. If we are committed to Rawls's conceptions of (a) citizens as free and equal persons and (b) society as a fair scheme of social cooperation among such citizens, then we have sufficient reason to employ the original position in order to identify the correct principles of legitimacy and justice.

But why should we accept Rawls's conceptions of citizens and society? Weithman suggests (in §XI.3) that we may find that, as citizens of liberal democratic societies, wealready are committed to them, at least if we reflect seriously upon our deepest political convictions and commitments. Or, if not, we may find that once we see what a society based on such conceptions looks like -- a well-ordered society based on justice as fairness -- we will become committed to them. In either case, the necessary justificatory work is to be done via "reflective equilibrium," not the identification of a "foundation for political liberalism" (p. 361).

The conception-based view, as formulated by Weithman, has much to recommend it. Ultimately, though, I find it unconvincing. The main reason is that it seems to ignore the pervasive and fundamental justificatory role of what Rawls calls the 'criterion of reciprocity' in political liberalism. Weithman does mention 'reciprocity' a number of times in his discussion, including noting that "The idea of reciprocity lies at the heart of Rawls's account of justice" (p. 272). Yet what Rawls calls the 'criterion of reciprocity' is neglected in the book.[3] This is surprising, given that Rawls refers to the criterion of reciprocity as expressing the "intrinsic (moral) political ideal" of justice as fairness (PL, p. xlv).

The criterion of reciprocity holds that "our exercise of political power is proper only when we sincerely believe that the reasons we offer for our political action may reasonably be accepted by other citizens as a justification of those actions" (PL, p. xliv). This looks like the 'acceptability requirement' that Weithman attributes to Larmore (p. 349). I find it hard to interpret the criterion of reciprocity as expressing anything other than a 'principle of respect for persons.' So I think that Larmore is broadly correct in identifying such a principle as the basis of political liberalism (though that principle justifies only indirectly the LPL, given that Rawls describes the LPL as "based on the criterion of reciprocity" (PL, pp. 446-447)).

It is because of the criterion of reciprocity's basic normative role in political liberalism that Rawls asserts that while there may exist "a family of reasonable political conceptions" of justice, "The limiting feature of these forms is the criterion of reciprocity" (PL, p. 450). And whatever Rawls regarded the exact relation between the LPL and the original position to be in his writings on political liberalism (in some places Rawls's treatment of the LPL and the original position suggest that the LPL is justified independently of the original position[4]), it is clear that the criterion of reciprocity is not, and indeed cannot be, justified by the original position. "[E]ach of us must have principles and guidelines to which we appeal in such a way that the criterion of reciprocity is satisfied," Rawls writes. "I have proposed that one way to identify those political principles and guidelines is to show that they would be agreed to in . . . the original position" (PL, pp. xlviii-xlix; see also pp. 226-227, 381). Thus it is the criterion of reciprocity that justifies the original position.

Understanding the criterion of reciprocity as expressing a principle of respect for persons is compatible, I think, with understanding that criterion as justified by reflective equilibrium. (A 'general' and 'wide' reflective equilibrium would exist in a well-ordered society in which different comprehensive doctrines endorsed the criterion of reciprocity for their own reasons.) So I disagree with Weithman that identifying a 'foundational principle' for political liberalism is in tension with the justificatory role of reflective equilibrium. Or at least I do not see how it is any more in tension with reflective equilibrium than identifying a basic ideal or set of ideals as instead doing the necessary normative work.

Alternatively, someone sympathetic to Weithman's conception-based view might claim that the criterion of reciprocity, as the 'intrinsic (moral) political ideal' of justice as fairness, is, along with the conceptions of citizens and society, part of the overall conception or ideal in question. It is this overall conception or ideal that justifies the original position and, in turn, the LPL and the principles of justice as fairness. But if this is so, then the distinction between the respect-based and conception-based views of political liberalism's normative basis seems to break down. This is because (as mentioned earlier) I find it difficult to see how the criterion of reciprocity could be understood as anything other than expressing a principle of respect for persons.


The objection that I just have outlined (assuming that it is successful) does not in any way undermine the main thesis of the book, which is that Rawls came to regard the account of stability advanced in section III of TJ as incompatible with other core elements of justice as fairness, and that the move to political liberalism was an attempt to provide an alternative account of stability. This thesis is comprehensively explained and, I think, successfully defended by Weithman. Moreover, the book also helpfully illuminates a number of other aspects of Rawls's political philosophy.

For instance, in reconstructing TJ's account of congruence in Chapters IV-VII, Weithman clarifies and ties together points that Rawls makes in very different parts of TJ, or which he mentions only briefly. Even readers familiar with TJ will learn much from reading these chapters. Weithman does an excellent job of explaining the important role played by the 'thin theory of the good' in supporting Rawls's arguments for congruence, and what he calls the 'bridge function' played by the original position in uniting the good and the right. The constraints of space prevent me from mentioning, let alone elaborating upon, many other valuable aspects of Weithman's discussion in these chapters.

Beyond helpfully illuminating relatively neglected aspects of TJ, this book provides an inspirational account of Rawlsian political liberalism. Weithman explains that the possibility of a just and stable well-ordered society can provide us, the citizens of existing unjust societies, with hope, by showing us that "a just society suits our nature" (p. 363). This possibility can ground a "reasonable faith in human beings and in the real possibility of a just, liberal and democratic society" (p. 231). Indeed, Weithman goes so far as to refer to Rawls's project as an exercise in "naturalist theodicy" (pp. 8, 14). By illuminating this aspect of Rawls's political philosophy, to which the concern with stability is central, I believe that Weithman's book constitutes a powerful reply to some recent criticisms of Rawls's focus on outlining what a 'realistic utopia,' a just well-ordered society, looks like.[5]

In short, Why Political Liberalism? is a wonderful book, one that is required reading for anyone with an interest in Rawls's political philosophy.

[1] Weithman notes some changes in Rawls's account of the sense of justice in chapters III, VIII, and IX.

[2] See especially C. Larmore, "The Moral Basis of Political Liberalism," The Journal of Philosophy 94 (1999): 599-625 (reprinted in C. Larmore, The Autonomy of Morality(Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008)).

[3] The only reference I could find is a quotation from Rawls on p. 294, n. 23.

[4] Consider the following passage: "Faced with the fact of reasonable pluralism, and granted that, on matters of constitutional essentials, basic institutions and public policies should be justifiable to all citizens (as the liberal principle of legitimacy requires), we allow to the parties [in the original position] the general beliefs and forms of reasoning found in common sense, and the methods and conclusions of science" (Rawls, Justice as Fairness, pp. 89-90, my italics). Elsewhere, Rawls indicates that the use of the original position in order to state 'more rigorously' the rationale for the LPL is optional (see PL, p. 137, n. 5).

[5] For instance: Raymond Geuss, Outside Ethics (Princeton NJ: Princeton University Press, 2005), and Amartya Sen, The Idea of Justice (Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 2009). Weithman discusses Geuss's criticisms at pp. 365-366.