Why Think? Evolution and the Rational Mind

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Ronald de Sousa, Why Think? Evolution and the Rational Mind, Oxford University Press, 2007, 187pp., $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195189858.

Reviewed by Craig DeLancey, State University of New York at Oswego


This is a delightful book, in which de Sousa articulates some challenging convictions concerning the role of rationality in human thought, while also retaining and making deft use of some of his longest-held views.

De Sousa's title is literal.  He means to address the very question of why thought -- that is, rational thought -- is useful.  In offering an answer, de Sousa characterizes rationality and irrationality; describes the role of rationality in human action; explores those features of mind, such as emotions, that play important roles in rational action; explores some examples of systematic irrationality; and lays out some of the implications of evolution for the skills that enable rationality.  The end result is a surprisingly rich book given its brevity.

Throughout, de Sousa is careful to distinguish normative and descriptive senses of "rational" and "rationality."  He calls descriptive rationality the categorial sense of "rationality."  This is the sense in which humans can be said to be rational animals.  Categorial rationality is characterized in part by thoughts that are a kind of computation, which de Sousa understands to be a process of manipulating digital representations.  This requires that we have a system of thought (that is, one or more brain modules) that has as its purpose taking representations as digital.

De Sousa therefore owes us a theory of purpose.  The second chapter of the book is devoted to a theory of teleofunctions.  De Sousa endorses an etiological explanation of teleofunctions, similar to Ruth Millikan's.  He considers some potential problems with the theory, which allows him to clarify that his approach requires reference to types that are reproduced repeatedly.  He is also liberal in his interpretation, allowing both a recent-history interpretation and a propensity interpretation of teleofunctions.  This might not sit easily with some -- these are usually seen as rival views -- but I think that any of the three (a Millikan style approach, a recent history view, or a propensity view) would be sufficient for de Sousa's remaining arguments.  Thus, whether one accepts or rejects his pluralism about teleology, his arguments should pass unscathed.

His view of teleofunctions not only makes sense of things like computation, but allows him in the rest of the book to explain the sense in which human capabilities can have a purpose, which in turn can be the source of the normative force of rationality.

With this in place, de Sousa can defend his guiding idea that rationality should allow us to have a better probability of success in some kinds of actions.  His overall view is that we have a range of evolved mental capabilities which enable us to plan and act in a way that sometimes meets certain standards.  The most general of these standards is that the skills on balance make the agent more likely to succeed in the relevant endeavor (which, given de Sousa's endorsement of an etiological theory of teleofunctions, must ultimately -- even if very indirectly -- amount to success in terms of increased fitness).

This approach to normative rationality is general enough to allow for great variation in what might count as rational, and de Sousa is clear that there is such variation and its conflicts are sometimes irresolvable.  He is what we might call a perspectivalist about rationality:  he describes several features of our perspective that can vary, and as a result alter our judgment of whether some particular action is rational.  One feature he calls "point of view."  Certain actions might be rational from a point of view of the community, but not the individual; and, of course, vice versa.  De Sousa here draws upon research in evolutionary game theory, describing conditions under which social pressures can enforce the evolution of a kind of behavior that is best understood as benefiting the community (presumably kin and offspring).  The distinction is not hard to accept, but de Sousa also explores a difficult ancillary issue:  what is an individual?  What is the particular thing being benefited in these various cases?  He sides with Dawkins, concluding that genes are the beneficiaries of natural selection.  Minds, however, endow us with an ability to associate our "self" with something other than our genes.

Another perspectival feature of rationality is how the individual discounts for time.  Humans, as is well known, tend to have a very great discounting factor, caring little for the distant future.  However, there is really no clear guide that would allow us to determine what discount rate is right or best, and so different discount factors can result in diverse but equally defensible courses of action.  But perspectivalism does not mean that all of one's actions are (collectively) rational.  De Sousa recognizes also that we sometimes simply fail, as do many of our other biological skills.  He devotes a chapter to discussing kinds of irrationality, such as superstitions and systematic errors in calculating risks.

In developing his views of rationality, de Sousa also provides a number of striking ideas about the nature of mind.  Three of these are ideas that de Sousa has long held (he originally articulated them in 1987 in his seminal book, The Rationality of Emotion), but they remain challenging and compelling claims that play an essential role in his final conception of rationality.

First of these is his contention that the mark of our special reasoning abilities, which arise with the capacity for language, is the ability to conceive of and refer to the particular.  Here he makes an essential distinction between the specific and the particular.  Specific reference may be a general reference made with a number of criteria -- such as, large marine mammal with echolocation abilities.  As my example makes clear, this narrows down the potential set of things to which we are referring, but it may not narrow it down to a single organism.  In contrast, a particular is by definition a single individual.  The concept of a particular individual is sui generis -- we do not get there by increasing specificity.  De Sousa argues that the ability to grasp the particular is the mark of full intentionality, and it is this which makes an animal (fully) rational.  This is a maverick view because many have conceived of intentionality as a process of being capable of abstraction, and of holding and ultimately reflecting upon concepts.

The ability to conceive of and refer to particulars allows for the possibility of taking individuals as a locus of value.  This results in an explosion of values.  Even if we were to attribute values to nonhuman, pre-rational organisms, de Sousa argues, their values would be relatively homogenous:  the natural goals shared by others of their species.  With the human explosion of values comes the possibility of conflict over values.  Two lions fighting over territory are not in conflict about values -- they both value territory and that is why they are fighting.  But humans can disagree over what is valuable, and as a result there can be conflicts not only about scarce goods, but about what is good.  This is an interesting view because it stakes out a middle ground between simplistic sociobiology and a view that human culture is irreducibly distinct from biology:  he has explained our diversity of values with a naturalist account, but the thesis itself entails that we will fail to explain many human conflicts with reference to pancultural inherited drives.

Second, de Sousa argues that a key problem in the philosophy of mind is also a problem of rationality:  the frame problem.  For the philosophy of mind, the frame problem arises when we try to understand how an agent determines what is relevant to evaluating a claim or situation.  Each fact leads to other facts -- but not all facts can be taken into consideration.  How do we "frame" the situation in order to evaluate it?  But this obviously applies to rationality as well.  To make a rational decision, how many facts about our situation need we take into account?  How "deep" should we analyze possible moves and countermoves of interpretation?  De Sousa's conviction remains that emotions help in this task, by pegging some perceptions or considerations as most salient.  Emotions "focus" us.

Third, de Sousa claims, emotions do more than this.  They provide a relation to the world that is in many ways akin to perception.  These perception-like states are in some senses, and to varying degrees, objective.  But they are also obviously in many ways projections.  Between these two extremes de Sousa argues there is a third way:  emotions reveal an "axiological domain," which is not reducible to practical or epistemic considerations, is not human independent, but is not wholly in our control or relative to whim.  Here again, he strikes a plausible middle position that is both naturalist but not simplistically reductive.

There is an emerging consensus -- arising from work in experimental economics, evolutionary game theory, constraint satisfaction theory, and other fields of study -- that humans rarely act like the calculating utility maximizers of economics or traditional game theory.  De Sousa's book could be seen as a contribution to that consensus:  he gives a strong defense of the importance and utility of rationality (and of truth, for that matter), but also retains a naturalist approach that starts from the recognition that humans are animals with an evolutionary history that has imbued them with a collection of fallible skills that constitute their minds.  Why Think? is an important touchstone in helping us to understand how we can approach rationality as a phenomenon that must ultimately be part of a successful theory of mind.