Why Tolerate Religion?

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Brian Leiter, Why Tolerate Religion?, Princeton University Press, 2012, 192pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691153612.

Reviewed by Robert Merrihew Adams, University of North Carolina, Chapel Hill


"Why tolerate religion?" The question is raised by someone who thinks there is something wrong about religion as such. To tolerate, Brian Leiter emphasizes, is to "put up" with beliefs or practices that one regards as "wrong, mistaken, or undesirable" (p. 8). His paradigm case of principled tolerance is one in which a "dominant group has the means at its disposal to effectively and reliably change or end [a] disfavored group's beliefs or practices, and yet . . . acknowledges that there are moral or epistemic reasons . . . to permit the disfavored group to keep on believing and doing what it does" (p. 13). Forcibly changing or ending religious belief has commonly been extremely difficult or impossible to achieve by any means short of total extermination or banishment of the disfavored group, as history shows, and is therefore a really scary project. With his stated paradigm in mind, we might think that Leiter's statement that "the contemporary problem, at least in the post-Enlightenment secular nations, . . . is why the state should tolerate religion as such at all" (pp. 14-15), would be ominous indeed if it were an accurate reading of political reality.

Fortunately and sensibly, Leiter does not hold that "the protection against intolerance [is] exhausted by a mere prohibition on annihilation or imprisonment of those with the disfavored beliefs and practices" (p. 109). The book's thoughtful and interestingly argued discussions of particular legal issues about tolerance (found mainly in the last of its five chapters) are generally not focused on questions of forcibly ending or fundamentally changing religious beliefs and practices, except for the most blatantly intolerable practices. Rather they concern public policies that (intentionally or unintentionally) limit the scope for exercise of the practices, or more generally disadvantage religious beliefs and practices or their adherents.

Among the conclusions for which Leiter argues are the following. There is indeed good reason, morally, on either utilitarian or broadly Kantian grounds, for tolerating beliefs and conscientious actions. These reasons, however, support tolerance of non-religious beliefs and conscientious actions as much as they support tolerance of religious belief and practice. And such tolerance must be limited by "some version of Mill's famous Harm Principle, according to which 'the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others.'"[1] Many religious believers are likely to agree with these conclusions, though they will probably disagree with much else in the book.

Less thoroughly argued and more questionable, I think, is Leiter's defense of the "No Exemptions" thesis, that "there do not need to be exemptions for claims of conscience from laws with neutral objectives" (p. 114). A law fails to have relevantly neutral objectives if one of its objectives is to disadvantage "dictates of conscience that do not violate the Harm Principle" (p. 114). Leiter allows, however, that "exemptions from generally applicable laws," in order to avoid burdening consciences, might be justified so long as it does not involve "shifting" burdens of the same or other sorts onto other people (p. 101).

In relation to the structure of Leiter's arguments, a fairly obvious objection to his defense of the No Exemptions thesis might appeal to John Rawls's argument for "the priority of liberty" in developing a theory of justice. Leiter quotes that argument at length as part of his own defense of a principle of toleration for conscientious beliefs and practices. He acknowledges that the argument that the parties in "the original position" would not "take chances with their liberty" (as Rawls puts it) "depends . . . on the thought that persons in the 'original position' know that they will have certain convictions about how they must act in certain circumstances -- convictions rooted in reasons central to the integrity of their lives" (pp. 16-17). A Rawlsian would presumably regard that consideration as justifying the parties in the original position in accepting principles of justice that give more weight to not burdening consciences than (say) to optimizing the availability of economic benefits that go beyond what people require for carrying out their rational plans of life. Such a conclusion seems implicit in Rawls's principle of "the priority of liberty."[2] I cannot see that Leiter has offered a rebuttal of such a Rawlsian position. He says, "If I am not reliably tracking the attitudes of readers of this book about the relative importance of the general welfare versus individual exceptions, then my arguments have run out." (p. 163, note 12). Fair enough, arguments do run out -- though it should be said that what is to be weighed in the balance against general welfare, in the cases under discussion, is not every sort of individual exception, but cases of individual conscience. And this is not a book whose readers are likely to be unanimous in their attitudes.

Chapters 2, 3, and 4 (the middle part of Why Tolerate Religion?) address the question "whether there is something special about religion that bears on religious toleration" (p. 26) in such a way as to provide reasons for toleration that are reasons only for tolerating religion. Leiter's negative answer to this question is the thesis that he seems most eager to establish in the book. He begins in chapter 2 by trying to identify distinctive features of religion that might be thought to provide special reasons for tolerating religion. As candidates for this role he discusses four features that he says are, or may be, distinctive of religious belief and essential to religion as such. Chapter 3 completes an argument that none of these features provides a good reason for extending more tolerance to religion than to other forms of belief and conscientious action.

Chapter 4 expands this discussion by addressing the question whether religion as such deserves, not just toleration, but a special respect which might bear on its legal standing. Leiter distinguishes minimal or recognition respect for other persons as having moral rights from affirmative respect, which requires a positive appraisal of some quality or performance of the person respected or esteemed. He argues that religious belief as such deserves minimal respect but not affirmative respect. In its most obvious sense, that is an uncontroversial conclusion. There are not many points of view, religious or non-religious, from which all forms of religious belief and religious behavior are appraised favorably. A more real question, it seems to me, is whether there are possibilities of religious life that do deserve a positive appraisal and affirmative respect even from people who do not share the beliefs involved in the life in question -- a respect widely accorded, for example, to the union of religious spirituality and moral commitment in a Mohandas Gandhi or a Desmond Tutu. Might such respect have some relevance to issues of toleration and peace among people of different religions and of no religion?

I found these middle chapters of the book disappointing, and was left wondering for what audience they were written. His arguments for their negative conclusion are likely to be found unsurprising by those who agree with Leiter in supposing that "religious belief in the post-Enlightenment era involves culpable failures of epistemic warrant" (p. 82). And religious believers are not likely to recognize their own religion in his characterization of religion, or to be won over by his insistence on an empiricist epistemology that does not clearly allow more room for metaphysical belief than the Vienna Circle did (p. 47).

From this point on, my critique will be focused on Leiter's characterization of religion. He speaks of "Defining Religion" (p. 31) -- a notoriously difficult and controversial project which he endorses (pp. 144-146, note 2). In practice he seems content with the slightly less burdensome task of identifying distinctive features of religion. Leiter supposes that his argument requires him to identify "features that all and only religious beliefs have" (p. 27). Even that may be too demanding. In the case of at least three of his four distinctive features, in fact, Leiter eventually denies (rightly, no doubt) that only religious beliefs have them. Indeed those denials are part of the argument for his negative conclusion.

The first of the four features is that (in Leiter's view):

for all religions there are at least some beliefs central to the religion that . . . issue in categorical demands on action -- that is, demands that must be satisfied no matter what an individual's antecedent desires and no matter what incentives or disincentives the world offers up (pp. 33-34).

It is not entirely clear to me what Leiter's criteria are for classifying a demand as categorical. He might easily be interpreted on this point as trying to fit all religious moralities into a Kantian framework that some of them would resist. But suppose we seek his criteria in the following statement, which he quotes from Rawls and treats as speaking of "categorical demands."

An individual recognizing religious and moral obligations regards them as binding absolutely in the sense that he cannot qualify his fulfillment of them for the sake of greater means for promoting his other interests (p. 55).[3]

That yields an interpretation of 'categorical demand' that dovetails nicely with Leiter's using this quotation in chapter 3 to ground an argument that though a "Rawlsian perspective" may ground reasons for tolerating conscientious belief and action,[4] it "cannot help us evaluate the principled case for toleration of religion qua religion" (p. 55). This treatment of Rawls does seem to imply that belief in categorical demands is not an exclusively religious phenomenon. And Leiter himself says that not all of "those who genuinely conduct their lives in accord with the categoricity of the moral demands they recognize" are religious (p. 38).

The second of the four features is that

for all religions there are at least some beliefs central to the religion that . . . do not answer ultimately (or at the limit) to evidence and reasons, as these are understood in other domains concerned with knowledge of the world. Religious beliefs, in virtue of being based on "faith," are insulated from ordinary standards of evidence and rational justification, the ones we employ in both common sense and in science (pp. 33-34).

This is the feature that Leiter comes closest to treating as unique to religion. It is also the one which seems least likely to ground any plausible claim to specially favorable treatment for religion, and which people who understand what Leiter is saying and see themselves as religious are least likely to agree is definitive of religion or essential to it. As Leiter acknowledges, of course, believers often give reasons for their religious beliefs, and such reasons have often been given by philosophers. The core of the view expressed in his account of this "feature," as his discussion of it makes clear, is that religion involves beliefs that do not satisfy his strict empiricist standards of justification. Given that epistemology is a domain of contestable, and contested, theories, his summary, unqualified description of this alleged feature of religion as "insulation from reasons and evidence" (p. 42) is hardly fair to theologians who do not share Leiter's epistemological views.

Leiter claims that "in the intellectualist traditions in religious thought . . . , it never turns out that the fundamental beliefs are revised in the light of new evidence" (p. 40). Unless by 'revised' Leiter means completely abandoned, this claim is simply false. The history of religious thought, in all religious traditions that I know about, is centrally a history of revision of more and less fundamental religious beliefs, in view of new experiences, new situations, new cultural developments, new knowledge about the world. Modern evolutionary biology, for example, has been rejected by some conservative Christians; but others, many of them quite conservative in other ways, have embraced it, revising their interpretations of Scripture in view of a new intellectual situation. Medieval writers spoke of such a process as "twisting the wax nose of authority." Because documents and traditions cannot be appropriated and applied without interpretation, authority cannot fail to have a wax nose. In such a process, of course, revisions are meant to maintain a core of belief that can be expressed verbally but is more stable than any of its verbal formulations. But that is a perfectly ordinary sort of reasoning, at work, for example, when an atomist physical theory is treated as a revision rather than a rejection of belief in "solid bodies." Why Tolerate Religion? manifests little engagement with serious history of religious thought.

The third of the four features is that "Religious beliefs involve, explicitly or implicitly, a metaphysics of ultimate reality." Leiter thinks this feature does not matter for his argument, because "so many different systems of belief involve views about ultimate reality," and because "the second feature, insulation from evidence . . . already captures . . . the metaphysical character of religious beliefs about ultimate reality" (p. 47). (As I don't use 'metaphysical' in a neo-positivist sense, I would say that beliefs about ultimate reality as such are metaphysical; but that does not matter to the argument at this juncture.)

The fourth feature is that "there are some beliefs in religion that . . . render intelligible and tolerable the basic existential facts about human life, such as suffering and death." In further discussion Leiter trivializes this feature (in my opinion) by referring to it, in a way that has somewhat hedonistic overtones, simply as "existential consolation" (p. 52). I believe it would do more justice to the reality of religious life to describe it as proposing ways of coming to terms with the basic conditions of our existence -- to which I would add that these are commonly ways of working at integrating world-view, self-understanding, personal meaning, and moral concern. No doubt it is true of these ends, however, as Leiter rightly says it is of existential consolation (p. 62), that there are ways in which non-religious individuals achieve them too, perhaps as successfully, by their own lights, as religious individuals do by theirs.[5]

Notably missing from Leiter's list of features of religion are its social, institutional, and ritual aspects. This is a surprising omission, given the extent to which legal issues about religion have been about liberty, and freedom from burdens, for these aspects of religion. To be sure, these aspects may be shared to a large extent by movements, such as Ethical Culture, which are not usually regarded as religious. Let us grant that such non-religious movements deserve as much constitutional protection as religious movements. It remains an obviously debatable question whether a "No Exemptions" principle does justice to values that may be realized in such social, institutional, and ritual forms.

[1] P. 22, quoting John Stuart Mill, On Liberty, ed. by Elizabeth Rapaport (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1978), p. 9.

[2] John Rawls, A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1979, pp. 90-95 and 243-51 (§§ 15 and 39).

[3] Quoting Rawls, A Theory of Justice, p. 207.

[4] As Leiter has agreed in chapter 1 (pp. 15-17).

[5] A much more comprehensive, though probably still not complete, articulation of functions of “the religious” in human life, and possibilities of appropriating them from a non-theistic perspective, can be found in John Dewey, A Common Faith (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1934), pp. 14-28.