Why We Disagree About Human Nature

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Elizabeth Hannon and Tim Lewens (eds.), Why We Disagree About Human Nature, Oxford University Press, 2018, 214pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198823650.

Reviewed by Tim Ingold, University of Aberdeen


Why are scientists and philosophers so unable to let go of the concept of human nature? They have shown, repeatedly, why there can be no such thing, how the idea of a universal essence at the core of our humanity flies in the face of what we know of the evolution of species, our own included, namely that it depends on a variability intrinsic to all living organisms. Yet here are a bunch of philosophers and scientists still arguing about it. Half are for, half against, yet all are broadly agreed on the rejection of any strong form of essentialism. No single paper is cited more often in this volume than an essay, 'On human nature', published by the philosopher David Hull in 1986. In it, Hull argued that if biological taxa are to be defined genealogically, by putative descent from a common ancestor, and if the species is such a taxon, then no feature can be common to each and every individual of a species. In the particular case of our own species, Homo sapiens, try as we might to settle on one or more distinguishing characteristics -- whether language, bipedalism, toolmaking, or anything else -- not only will we find creatures born of man and woman in whom, for whatever reason, it is lacking or fails to develop, but we can also never rule out the possibility of finding creatures of non-human parentage who possess these characteristics, if not now then sometime in the evolutionary future. For all we know, a million years hence, the descendants of present-day apes -- if we have not first brought them to extinction -- will be walking and talking as much as we do. They are already making rudimentary tools. But none of this would make them human in any sense consistent with evolutionary biology.

Why, then, in the face of all reason, does controversy over human nature persist? Why will the idea not go away? A temptation, shared by several of the contributors, is to blame its tenacity on 'the folk' -- a somewhat derogatory label that apparently covers everyone, quite indiscriminately, who is not by trade a philosopher or a scientist. The idea won't go away, we are told, since it is continually reproduced in folk discourse. Cross-cultural studies in cognitive psychology purport to have shown that in the identification and classification of living things, especially animals, folk are predisposed to essentialism. They are inclined to think that thanks to its parentage, every animal is born to be the sort of animal that it is, that it shares an inheritance which is both indelible and typical for every member of its kind, and that this inheritance lays down, from the start, a project that, in its life, the animal is destined to fulfil. Karola Stotz and Paul Griffiths (p.60) call this the 'genetic essentialist framework' (GEF). Indeed, it is not hard to see the GEF at work in much of the popular discourse surrounding human nature in contemporary western societies. And if that is really the way folk are ordinarily primed to think, then, as another of the contributors -- Cecilia Heyes -- has it, no amount of dissuasion by scientists and philosophers is likely to put an end to it. Rather than seeking to eliminate the concept of human nature, Heyes thinks (p.76), it would make more sense to hang on to it, and to seek to redefine it in a way that is compatible with scientific principle. Then, at least, the public might be persuaded to attend to what science has to say on the matter. For otherwise -- were science to pull the plug on the concept -- the public, in its ignorance, would simply carry on talking about human nature in a way that is scientifically illiterate.

To recover the concept of human nature for science, however, would mean rescuing it from the strong version of essentialism so effectively demolished by Hull, and that is precisely what its defenders in this volume endeavour to do. Perhaps, for example, it could serve a purely descriptive purpose as a rough and ready characterisation of humankind, of the sort that one might include in a field guide for the identification of Earth-inhabiting species, to be placed in the hands of visiting Martians. Or perhaps we could use the concept, as does Edouard Machery, to refer to whatever general features of human beings have manifestly evolved, such as the distinctive crown of the skull housing massively enlarged frontal lobes, or the musculoskeletal modifications that accompanied the evolution of upright posture, but to the exclusion of traits whose near-universal distribution owes nothing to evolutionary processes. Or again, with Grant Ramsey, we could adopt a more developmentally oriented view, taking human nature to embrace the general patterns of human life woven by the entire gamut of possible pathways it can take, without having to discriminate between what humans owe to their biological evolution and what they do not.

Whichever strategy we adopt, and all have their pros and cons meticulously laid out by their respective advocates, the result is what might be called a 'weak' essentialism. Opponents, for their part, argue that this weakening renders the concept of human nature effectively useless. If it fails to measure up to the tasks of either description, explanation or classification, then what is the point of retaining it? We might go with John Dupré in observing that every living organism is not an entity but a process, a life-cycle, and that no phase in the cycle can be singled out as any more indicative of its nature than any other. With Kim Sterelny, we might worry that appeals to human nature could obscure as much as reveal potential forms of human life and social organisation, or, with Kevin N. Laland and Gillian R. Brown, we could point to the way that constructing the human -- both in idea and in fact -- is an ongoing, inter-generational project, which will never be complete. Or again, we could follow Peter J. Richerson, in arguing that in the long course of human evolution, genetic and cultural processes have ever been entwined, and that a concept of human nature that overly privileges the former is bound to be misleading.

Whatever line we take, however, to agree or disagree means joining the conversation. Yet as a conversation, at least in the way it comes over in this book, it is markedly one-sided. Heyes, for example, wants to retain the concept of human nature in order to keep open a channel of communication between science and the public, in the hope that they will listen to science and avail themselves of its findings. There is little sign, however, that science is remotely interested in listening to members of the public, save in experimental contexts in which they have been recruited for the purposes of psychological research. Nor, for researchers, does what they have to say hold any interest in itself. It is of interest only for what it has to say about them, about their attitudes, predispositions and biases, for example towards essentialism. Scientists, along with their philosophical cheerleaders, are reluctant to admit that people with experience in other walks of life are equally capable of deep and disciplined thought, or that they might have valuable insights to offer. The default assumption is rather that, in their comparative ignorance, the public has nothing to contribute to the conversation.

For a volume dedicated to the question of human nature, it is remarkable that real-life human beings scarcely figure in its pages, least of all as interlocutors, having been effectively replaced by robotic trait-carriers, creatures of the scientific imagination whose behaviour can be modelled from first principles without our actually having to engage with them. Indeed, were we to model scientists in the same way that scientists model everyone else, what grounds would we have to take any of their pronouncements seriously? Not only does science appear unwilling to attend to, let alone learn from, the experience of those condescendingly described as 'laypersons'; it also goes out of its way to protect its own, internal conversation from contamination by unruly, non-scientific elements. As Maria Kronfeldner puts it, in a laudably critical contribution, 'contemporary scientific approaches that use the concept of human nature will try to prevent the exchangeability of the content with the vernacular concept' (p.187).

There is nothing worse, for the advocates of such approaches, than to allow our understanding to be clouded by faith or intuition. The study of human nature, they insist, belongs to science, and science alone. Consider, for example, this robust proclamation from Ramsey:

If human nature is not based on intuition or religious texts, but is instead based on what we do and how and why we do it, human nature should be aligned with the human sciences. We can thus consider human nature to be the subject of the human sciences. (p.50)

Now of course, what people do, why and how, can be guided by both intuitive judgement and religious prescription. What Ramsey seems to be saying, however, is that to study human nature is to set aside whatever people might feel about their doings, as well as any moral or religious conviction with which they may be freighted, in favour of a scientifically dispassionate observation of human behaviour, as it were from the outside. It is to place scientists in a realm above and beyond the world they study, immunised from any infection that might come from a too close or intimate contact with it. Now of course it is precisely this closeness and intimacy -- this feeling for the world of which we are intrinsically a part, and to which we owe our very existence as living beings within it -- that lies at the heart of intuitive or religious sensibility. Ramsey's declaration, in writing off such sensibility from any study of what it means to be human, amounts in effect to a defence of normal science, and of the absolute separation of knowing from being on which it depends. Yet are not practitioners of the human sciences -- among whom Ramsey includes psychologists, sociologists, anthropologists and economists -- also human beings themselves? And as such, are they not inevitably embroiled in responsibilities towards those among whom they work and study, and whose ways they seek to understand?

One of the oddities of this book is that while its contributors have much to say about the concept of nature, and its application to humanity, they are largely silent about the concept of the human itself. Yet like the concept of nature, the concept of human has a particular history in western discourses that has been decisively inflected by the rise of modern science. What science did was to split the human into two: on the one side lie human beings; on the other lies the condition of being human. Human beings -- with which the chapters of this book are primarily concerned, albeit largely in absentia -- are individuals of a species. They are imagined, for the most part, as objects of empirical inquiry, pre-programmed with traits that are supposed to have been bestowed upon them by either genetic inheritance or social learning, or by some combination of the two. Human beings can be addressed as such, however, only after the question of being human has been already asked, and answered, in a certain way. This question is not empirical but ontological: it is about the condition of being. And the answer that science demands, and indeed requires, is that to be human is to attain a condition that transcends the world in which the existence of all other creatures is confined. Only then can one look back on this world from a stance of objectivity. And what do we see? Amongst other creatures we see individuals of the species Homo sapiens. We see ourselves. Arguably the very significance of the word 'human', in the discourses of modernity, lies in its duplicity: in the fact that we cannot refer to the species without invoking the condition, and vice versa. In effect, the concept of the human has come to epitomise the dilemma of a creature that can know itself, and the world of which it is a part, only by taking itself out of that world and viewing it, as it were, from the far side.

The project of science is impaled on the horns of this dilemma. One consequence is that some humans appear more human than others: scientists more than laypersons, adults more than children, modern people more than traditional folk -- the latter allegedly fated to write out their acquired traits rather than thinking and acting for themselves. It is precisely on account of this consequence that many contemporary scholars are urging us to find a way that would take us beyond the concept of humanity, even to a 'post-human' world in which these invidious distinctions would cease to apply. The contributors, however, are largely untroubled by matters of this kind. For them the ontological question has long since been settled. Yet it continues to hover, unawares, in the background. There is something almost pathetic in the spectacle of eminent scientists and philosophers carrying on their persnickety debates about human nature while totally oblivious to the elephant in the room, namely the essence of being human, otherwise known as the 'human condition', which provides the metaphysical platform for their deliberations and invests them with their authority. Our authors can only disagree about human nature because they are all in tacit agreement when it comes to the human condition. Their scientific project depends on it. In fact, it is the scientists, and not the much maligned 'folk', who are closet essentialists, for the simple reason that they could not otherwise practise their kind of positive science. That is why, however hard they may try, they never manage to escape from an essentialist concept of the human. The problem lies not with the 'folk', but with science itself.

Indeed for many people from around the world -- perhaps the majority -- the question of human nature hardly registers. They neither agree nor disagree with the idea, since they have no concepts directly comparable to ours of either 'human' or 'nature'. The claim of psychologists to have established a predisposition to essentialism as a cross-cultural universal can only be sustained by ignoring the weight of ethnographic evidence to the contrary -- evidence that points to a great deal of flexibility and openness to experience in human approaches to figuring out what things are, and a willingness to accept not only that things may not be what they seem but also that their stability cannot be assumed. But if this is so -- if matters of human nature are not, in fact, on the radar of most people on the planet -- then thebook's title, Why we disagree about human nature, raises a further question: who, exactly, are 'we'? For the conversation, as we have seen, excludes not only those for whom the concept of human nature has no resonance in their discourse, but also those for whom it most definitely does, but whose appeal to faith or intuition disqualifies them from having anything to contribute. At the end of the day, it appears that the 'we' of the title is narrowed down to only those who subscribe to the protocols of normal science. Everyone else, including scholars of all stripes who do not sign up for these protocols, are lumped with the public or the folk. They may be treated as subjects of study but are cut out of the conversation.

While apparently admitting a plurality of voices, this book in fact establishes a claim of ownership: the question of human nature belongs to science, or more particularly, to those branches of science that present themselves as 'evolutionary'. In the marketplace of knowledge production, as Kronfeldner points out (p.190), every scientist wants his or her work to stand out, and to be marked with the seal of authority. To appeal to nature, then, is not to state a fact but to make a claim. This is exactly what Ramsey does, in the passage cited earlier, where he confers on the human sciences the sole authority to study human nature. Theologians, who make it their business to study 'religious texts', are categorically excluded. Dupré, though offering a slightly different perspective, concurs. Noting some parallels between his processual approach and the philosophical system of Alfred North Whitehead, he is nevertheless keen to distance himself from the latter on account of its 'theological and idealistic elements' (p.94). I have no particular wish to mount a defence of theology. I do however want to insist that the problem of human nature is not one that can be resolved behind closed doors by a bunch of philosopher-scientists convinced of their superior powers of intellect and united in their disdain for anyone who does not sign up to their peculiar version of human exceptionalism. Human nature matters, and not just for science. It has consequences for people, both presently and for generations to come, that are both political and ethical.

The political consequences lie in the reproduction of power relations that systematically disenfranchise those humans -- laypersons, children, 'folk' -- deemed to be of lesser humanity. And the ethical consequences lie in the science's abjuration, in the name of objectivity, of care and responsibility towards the world of which it speaks. To recover its ethical and political purpose, science must be restored to that world, and to the relations and processes of which it is constituted and to which it owes its very existence. This is to put existence before essence, becoming before being, the process of humaning before the condition of humanity. As I have suggested elsewhere (Ingold 2017), we have to turn 'to human' into a verb. Only then can the spectre of essentialism finally be laid to rest. Yet this also means embracing the sensibilities of faith and intuition, and the commitments of care and responsibility towards our fellow humans, that science has -- up to now -- been at such pains to avoid. Above all, it means taking other people seriously, on the default assumption that they are as intelligent, wise and knowledgeable as we are. We have so much to learn from them.

In this volume, one contribution stands alone in taking this approach, and its divergence from all the others in striking. It comes from the social anthropologist Christina Toren and forms the penultimate chapter. As the only chapter to challenge the dominant scientific consensus, it carries a heavy burden. We should be prepared, Toren argues, to listen to what others say, do and think, in their own terms, before foisting our own concepts on them (p.170). For humans, she insists, are not just products of gene-environment interactions -- as Laland and Brown, for example, would have it (p.132). They are themselves, both singly and collectively, the producers of their lives. Each life is a local history, produced in and through the unfolding of the social relations within which it is borne along, and these histories together make up a process of evolution that is going on throughout the lifeworld. This relational approach to evolution is radically at odds with orthodox Darwinism, with its focus on the selection and retention of inherited, context-independent variation, and to which the majority of biologists and psychologists still adhere. Yet while Toren may be a lone voice in this book, she is not, as she pretends (p.175), a lone voice in the field. Many of us are thinking along the same lines. Indeed we are already in the throes of a revolution in the human sciences every bit as great as that wrought, in its own day, by the Darwinian paradigm. It is drawing towards a synthesis that is at once processual, developmental and relational. Perhaps with this synthesis, we'll at last be able to put the concept of human nature behind us, once and for all.


Hull, D. L. 1986. 'On human nature'. Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association 2: 3-13.

Ingold, T. 2017. '"To human" is a verb'. In Verbs, bones, and brains: interdisciplinary perspectives on human nature, eds. A. Fuentes and A. Visala. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, pp. 71-87.