Why We Need Ordinary Language Philosophy

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Sandra Laugier, Why We Need Ordinary Language Philosophy, Daniela Ginsburg (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2013, 147pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226470542.

Reviewed by Julia Tanney, University of Kent


Originally published by Vrin in 2000 under the title Du réel à l'ordinaire: Quelle philosophie du langage aujourd'hui?, this timely English translation joins a welcome list of recent attempts to insist that the neglected insights of Austin, Wittgenstein, and other so-called 'ordinary language philosophers' have a rightful place in the current debate among philosophers of the 'analytic' or 'Anglo-Saxon' tradition.

Sandra Laugier covers a wealth of authors, focusing in the end on what can be elicited from the practice of ordinary language philosophy. But what to my mind is particularly special about Laugier's approach (upon which this review will focus) is that she begins with Quine -- the erstwhile forefather of philosophical naturalism -- and shows that he, Austin and Wittgenstein share, in their different ways, a criticism of meaning conceived as a 'core common to different languages' or 'the idea of an intermediary entity that would guarantee equivalence or correspondence between them' (16). In Quine, this denunciation of 'the myth of meaning' is simultaneously a criticism of referential or denotational theories as well as of a realism that aspires to a 'shared ontology common to different physical theories or conceptual schemes' (16).

In postwar England, the criticism of the myth was explicit in Ryle (neglected in this book) as early as 1929 as well as in Austin and, most famously, the later Wittgenstein. Their work opened up a different way of understanding meaning, not as Sinn or 'propositional content' construed as an intermediary between expressions that 'mean the same', which allegedly accompany our utterances -- but instead (in my words) as a shifting series of commitments that are implicitly undertaken as the target expressions are appropriately or correctly employed from one circumstance to another. On this view (still in my words) to learn about meaning is to learn about what is meant; that is, what is said, explained, predicted, argued, promised, threatened, expressed, etc. This involves tracing what Ryle calls the 'logical powers' of the sentences, and their constituent expressions, as they take on different 'inflections of meaning' or 'elasticities of significance' within the various situations in which they are employed to perform their multitudinous jobs. But this 'conceptual cartographical' approach (a description I prefer to 'ordinary language') has all but disappeared in Europe. More alarming, as Laugier points out, it was hardly ever visible in America. What, she asks, drove this particular schism in the history of analytic philosophy?

As early as 'Two Dogmas', Laugier reminds us, Quine described the conceptual scheme of science as a tool with which to predict future experience in the light of past. Physical objects, he continued, are useful intermediaries conceptually imported not from definition in terms of experience, but rather as irreducible posits or constructs 'comparable, epistemologically, to the gods of Homer' (Quine, From a Logical Point of View, quoted in Laugier, 21). The myth of physical objects is more efficacious than other myths insofar as it provides a structure to the flux of experience. But is that all? Is there a deep reason this myth is successful? According to Laugier, this starting point of Quine's work has fuelled subsequent discussions of realism in metaphysics and epistemology: 'The question of realism -- the question of the reality of the entities postulated by theories to account for experience, and of the irreducibility of these entities (posits) to sensorial data -- is at the very starting point of Quine's philosophy' (21-22).

For Quine, as for Hume, our experience gives us neither knowledge nor objects. Instead, Laugier says, Quine is committed to saying that our objects are posits and our ontology is relativized to a choice of background theory. Indeed, she adds later, Quine's reconstrual of ontology involves a 'triple relativization': one can ask what exists only in terms of what a theory says exists and what a theory says exists can only be understood against a background theory. Even so, the translation of the object theory into the background theory will, necessarily, be indeterminate (including, incidentally, the very notion of 'fact of the matter', which, Laugier points out, is 'internal' to our theory of nature).

The problem according to Laugier is that, though for Quine, 'the question of realism is in any case immanent' (24), and though his 'givens' -- 'sensory stimulations' and 'surface irritations' -- are relativized in a way described above, there is still a tension with his claim to be a 'robust' realist, especially as this has been understood by subsequent generations of metaphysicians. For 'all of American philosophy of language,' she says (concurring with Putnam) is based on the idea that 'we have "only" experience, and from it we must produce knowledge, invent language, construct our theories. What a miracle -- how do we do it?' (25).

Indeed, she continues, this is the third dogma of empiricism that Davidson identified in his criticism of 'the very idea of a conceptual scheme': the dualism of scheme and content, of organizing system and something waiting to be organized. But, claims Laugier, in rejecting this dogma and perhaps empiricism tout court, Davidson himself seems to miss the 'radical' conclusion it suggests: that it is also necessary to give up on what philosophers of language (including Davidson) understand by their subject: namely, the absurdity or 'spuriousness' of asking about language's adequacy to the world.

Although Quine's notion of logic-as-regimentation for the language of science is preferable to the logicist's dream of using formalism to discover the structures of thought and language, it still inherits the problem of realism, including, Laugier insists, some of the exaggerated reactions against it.

Rorty, for example, goes too far in stating that after Quine's and Davidson's criticisms, there is no point in studying language in order to discover anything about reality. For even if Quine and Davidson are right (after Wittgenstein and others) to have renounced representational theories of language, Laugier argues, it does not follow that there is no project that involves scrutinizing 'what we say' in natural (non-formal) language in order to understand what is meant, in the ordinary sense(s) of that word. There is no reason, for example, to shy away from examining our uses of 'true' as Laugier points out that Austin does in order to learn something about truth or, for example of 'about', as Ryle does, in order, for example, to debunk the idea that there is an 'aboutness relation'. We thus learn what is true or the variety of ways of being 'about' in the senses in which these notions can be reclaimed. Not as notions immanent to science and conceptual schemes, but rather as 'inherent to our common use of language' (22). With this reclamation we can agree, with Laugier, that 'the ordinary notion of true . . . seems in spite of everything to define something about the relation we establish between language and the world, and about the affirmation, inherent in our use of language, that language does indeed speak about something' (38).

The interest of Laugier's project is, first, to remind her readers that the father of naturalism rejected many of the presuppositions that fund their own projects. But she also takes her readers through a journey in which they come to see, as she eventually did, that the irreconcilable demands in Quine -- to affirm realism within an empiricist framework -- cannot be met. Instead she proposes to move from Quine's rejection of the myth of meaning qua intermediary (a rejection he has in common with the 'ordinary language' philosophers) and to drop 'once and for all' the empiricist ideal. In particular, we must renounce the kind of empiricism that 'makes us expect knowledge to come from our "nerve endings"' (22).

Instead, as Laugier maintains, 'language as it was first put forward to philosophy [was] not as something made, but as simply "given," already there' (31). Indeed, it derives, as Austin maintains, from 'the inherited experience and acumen of many generations of men. (Austin, Philosophical Papers; cited in Laugier, 66).'

And it is with this thought, Laugier argues, that we can find a resurrected sort of realism. For as Austin and Wittgenstein (and Ryle) show in their arguments, though it is often a long and difficult process, we do tend to come to agreement. Language should be construed, not as a body of statements or words, but as the place of agreement on what we should say when. Nonetheless, as Austin insists, 'When we examine what we should say when, what words we should use in what situations, we are looking again not merely at words (or 'meanings' whatever they may be) but also at the realities we use the words to talk about' (Austin, ibid, 182; cited in Laugier, 67). Or, as Laugier adds on Austin's behalf, 'the examination of language is not "a way to access" phenomena: it is the examination of facts. . . . Language (our language) is not a reflection or form of experience; it is, for Austin, part of experience' (63). To put it Wittgenstein's way, 'the speaking of a language is part of an activity or a form of life' (Philosophical Investigations, §23). Thus to reflect on language is to reflect on what is revealed within and by the multitudinous activities that constitute it.