Wilderness, Morality, and Value

Wilderness Morality And Value

Joshua Duclos, Wilderness, Morality, and Value, Lexington Books, 2022, 162pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781666901368.

Reviewed by Kyle Johannsen, Trent University


Joshua Duclos’s clearly-written, well-argued book Wilderness, Morality, and Value (henceforth referred to as WMV) analyzes the incredibly important and, until recently, almost entirely neglected problem of wild animal suffering. Though it is the second traditionally-published moral philosophy book on this subject, and though a third such book is currently forthcoming, WMV is unique. Unlike my 2021 book Wild Animal Ethics, and unlike Catia Faria’s soon-to-be-released (Dec 2022) book Animal Ethics in the Wild (which I had the pleasure of reviewing for Cambridge UP), Duclos’s book is specifically about the relationship between the value of wild animals’ welfare and the value of wilderness. By focusing his book in this way, Duclos accomplishes two goals. First, he provides an account of wilderness’s value that doesn’t rely either on rosy assumptions about wild animals’ welfare levels, or on pessimistic assumptions about the effects of beneficent intervention. Second, he sheds light on some important grounds underlying one of the main intuitions against intervening to help wild animals—namely, the intuition that we should leave natural areas (wilderness areas) as they are.

WMV is in some respects a defence of wilderness and in other respects a critique of it. On the one hand, Duclos argues that there’s nothing wrong with the concept of wilderness. In Chapter 1, he notes, among other things, that it’s appropriate to refer to some areas as ‘wilderness’ even if it’s true that hardly anywhere on Earth is entirely unaffected by human behavior. The naturalness of different areas admits of degrees, so all that must be true of a tract of land for it to be appropriately called ‘wilderness’ is that it be significantly more natural than areas we don’t refer to as ‘wilderness’, such as cities (4-6).

On the other hand, Duclos is critical of the idea that wilderness possesses non-anthropocentric value (value that doesn’t come from humans). Though environmentalists commonly argue that wilderness is valuable because wild animals have an interest in it—that is, that it’s valuable at least in part because it provides a habitat for wild animals, Duclos points to a number of difficulties with this claim. First, the wild animals who live in wilderness typically have extremely difficult lives. In fact, due to the prevalence of reproductive strategies whereby parents produce large numbers of offspring but devote little energy to each individual offspring, most individual wild animals don’t survive long. The vast majority of sentient individuals die early in life from painful natural causes such as starvation, predation, disease, exposure, injury, etc. (32). Second, though it seems fair to say that destroying their habitat damages the interests of wild animals, habitat destruction is merely a paradigmatic case of wilderness reduction. Since human interventions of any sort reduce wilderness’s naturalness (and thus reduce wilderness), including interventions designed to aid wild animals, it isn’t true that reducing wilderness is necessarily contrary to wild animals’ interests (35-36). Indeed, some interventions, if researched sufficiently and conducted with an appropriate amount of care, promise to considerably improve wild animals’ lives. Possibilities that Duclos suggests may be worthy of research include interventions that aim to reduce predation and to control wild animal populations in a more humane manner (33). In light of the scope and severity of wild animal suffering, Duclos argues that wilderness in and of itself—what he calls wilderness as wilderness—does not derive any non-anthropocentric value from the well-being of wild animals. 

It might seem that a more expansive conception of the moral community would suffice to secure non-anthropocentric value for wilderness, but Duclos correctly observes that this is a dead end. Natural ecosystems are less stable than some people imagine them to be, and non-sentient wildlife is subject to the same evolutionary pressures that sentient wildlife is. Expanding the moral community to include either ecosystems or non-sentient individuals would increase, rather than decrease, our reasons to intervene in wilderness (70).

Though skeptical that wilderness in and of itself possesses non-anthropocentric value, Duclos observes that it does seem to possess anthropocentric value. However, specifying the manner in which it’s anthropocentrically valuable is tricky. There do seem to be some relatively obvious ways in which wilderness is valuable to human beings—for example, it provides us with space for recreation and social bonding, is aesthetically pleasing, and so on. The problem is that wilderness is merely (and at best) a sufficient condition for such goods (84-85). Recreation, social bonding, and aesthetic enjoyment are all available in cities and other human-made spaces. Hypothetically speaking (and perhaps in real life, too), we could also create artificial areas that closely resemble wilderness, thereby affording ourselves opportunities for recreation and aesthetic pleasure that are more or less indistinguishable from the opportunities afforded by wilderness. We could even try to trick ourselves and others into thinking that these areas really are wild. If something important seems to be missing from such areas and from the experiences we’d have in them, then we’ll need to dig deeper to see why—that is, to understand why wilderness as wilderness matters to us (85-88).

WMV suggests two different ways we might reasonably try to interpret or understand the value of wilderness as wilderness, neither of which (according to Duclos) convincingly counters the claim that we should intervene to improve wild animals’ welfare. I’ll address both possibilities shortly, but before I do, it’s worthwhile to take note of the book’s axiological focus. WMV is a book about values: the value of wilderness, the value of wild animal welfare, the relationship between these values, and the reasons for action that these values present us with. One of the main questions the book asks is whether the pro tanto reason that wild animals’ welfare gives us to intervene is defeated by the pro tanto reason that the preservation of wilderness gives us to refrain from doing so. What WMV isn’t is a book about duty

I don’t think there’s anything particularly wrong with focusing on axiology. Work about values is, after all, central to moral philosophy. However, part of our interest in values is derived from the justificatory connection they have with our duties. As a result, there are certain questions about values that can’t be asked without also discussing duty. With respect to WMV in particular, one duty-related question worth asking is whether the counter-intuitiveness of humanitarian intervention in nature is at least partly traceable to respect for deontic constraints. All other things being equal, improving wild animals’ welfare is good, but doing so may also be wrong, all things considered, if we must treat some animals disrespectfully in the process. To be fair, Duclos does note that our pro tanto reason to assist wild animals is contingent upon our acquiring sufficient knowledge to intervene effectively, that is, without accidentally doing more harm than good (34-35, 99-100). However, this condition is rather axiological. Sure, we shouldn’t intervene unless we’re justified in believing that the effects of our interventions will be net positive. Fallibility is an important consideration that constrains, but does not bar, justified intervention. But perhaps there are additional conditions that interventions must meet to be morally permissible? Perhaps we’re sometimes obligated to refrain from intervening even when the effects would be net positive? For example, some of the interventions Duclos considers, such as genetically editing predators (34-35), would presumably require experimenting on animals. Using some animals as experimental tools for the improvement of other animals’ welfare may be wrong even when the benefits enjoyed by the latter exceed the harms done to the former. Another possibility worth considering is that humanitarian intervention in nature would be impermissibly paternalistic. 

My own view is that the above challenges are surmountable. In Wild Animal Ethics (2021), I argue that we have a collective duty of beneficence to assist wild animals, and that this duty is defensible within a broadly deontological framework. Still, worries about deontic constraints motivate some of the opposition to helping wild animals, so they’re worries worth engaging with.

As I mentioned above, WMV suggests two different ways to understand the value of wilderness as wilderness. Duclos arrives at the first after analyzing a well-known argument against human enhancement put forward by Michael Sandel. In The Case Against Perfection (2007), Sandel argues that genetically enhancing ourselves is contrary to accepting what he calls the ‘giftedness’ of human life, and that we have a number of different reasons to accept life’s giftedness. Though Duclos argues that most of these reasons are inapplicable to beneficent intervention in the wild, he does think that one reason applies. Accepting that we should modify our genetic make-up for our benefit—that the genetic endowment we and our descendants receive is not simply a natural circumstance beyond our control—involves an expansion of moral responsibility, and expanding what we’re morally responsible for is burdensome. Similarly, accepting that we should modify wilderness for wild animals’ benefit is burdensome. Given that we have an interest in avoiding burden, it seems that we also have an interest in leaving wilderness as it is. That assisting wild animals would require some level of sacrifice seems obvious enough. As Duclos notes, however, it isn’t plausible to claim that our prudential reason to avoid the burdens is stronger than our moral reason to assist wild animals. The scope and severity of wild animal suffering is far too great (109-11).

Though I agree with Duclos, I also think that this is  an area where some duty-related questions should be addressed. One sort of question we might ask concerns the relationship between burdensomeness and any duty we may have to intervene to help wild animals. Though we have a compelling moral reason to intervene, perhaps, in light of the burdens, we should conclude that intervention is merely supererogatory. In fact, Duclos himself is reluctant to claim that we have a duty to assist wild animals. In one of the few places where he refers to ‘duty’, he indicates that if our pro tanto reason to intervene is decisive (not overridden by countervailing considerations), it follows that we should intervene, even though we may not have a moral duty to intervene (38-39). As far as I can tell, this is the same as claiming that intervention is pro tanto praiseworthy but not necessarily pro tanto obligatory. As I mentioned before, my own view is that we do have a duty of beneficence to intervene, albeit a collective one analogous to the duties of humanitarian assistance we owe to foreign nations in times of emergency. I won’t press the point here, though. What I will note is that the concept of duty is relevant to intervention even if we don’t think that beneficence is obligatory. In the event that we decide to intervene, we in turn become morally responsible for the effects our interventions cause. For example, in the event that we intervene to reduce predation, we in turn become responsible for either preventing or mitigating any harmful, foreseeable side effects—for example, for preventing the relevant prey populations from becoming too large. We would also become responsible for monitoring our interventions for any unforeseen side effects. In other words, by increasing our level of causal entanglement with ecosystems, intervening in nature has the potential to create duties that we would not otherwise have had. Such duties wouldn’t be new, of course. We already extensively intervene in nature for both anthropocentric and ecological reasons, we just tend not to pay attention to our interventions’ impact on wild animal welfare, a point made vivid by the fact that animal welfare is not (but should be) included in the impact assessments used to evaluate environmental and other types of policy (McCulloch and Reiss 2017). Since it’s likely neither feasible nor desirable for us to stop intervening in nature, it’s important that we start taking responsibility for the effects our interventions have on individual wild animals’ lives.

Duclos’s second suggestion for interpreting the value of wilderness as wilderness, is that it be understood as a spiritual value. He notes that in a secular age where theism is waning, wilderness has become a spiritual substitute of sorts for many people. It’s a ‘sacred other’ that we don’t have control over, the continued existence of which entails that we’re not entirely alone in the world. In an increasingly human-made, human-controlled world, wilderness remains under the control of nature (112-115).

Unlike whatever interest we may have in avoiding the burden of responsibility, Duclos concludes that a spiritual valuation of wilderness does, in a sense, have the power to justify neglecting wild animal welfare. However, it doesn’t do so by providing a sufficiently powerful, countervailing reason. Instead, a spiritual valuation has the power to supersede moral reasoning. In other words, though we have strong moral reasons to prevent and alleviate suffering, moral reasoning should be suspended with respect to suffering in the wild if wilderness is an amoral, sacred space. Duclos uses Kierkegaard’s discussion of Abraham and Isaac to illustrate. Though it was irrational for Abraham to conclude that he could sacrifice Isaac to God and somehow still have descendants (Isaac was his only child and Sarah—Abraham’s wife—was no longer fertile), religion requires faith, and faith supersedes rationality. Similarly, though it seems morally erroneous to value wilderness more than the welfare of the sentient beings within it, religion requires faith, and faith supersedes morality (117-119).

For his part, Duclos takes note of various problems facing a spiritual valuation of wilderness. Among other things, he notes that it’s unclear whether a spiritual valuation gives those who lack a spiritual connection with nature any reason to resist assisting wild animals. Religious accommodations are important within liberal democracies, but many reject the idea that respect for religious freedom justifies sacrificing the welfare of some for the religious preferences of others (122-123). For my part, I think the claim that wilderness is a spiritual (and thus problematic) value is quite compelling. The idea that nature is good is certainly a big part of monotheistic theology. Monotheistic frameworks maintain that, with the exception of human action, God causes everything. They also maintain that God is all-powerful, all-knowing, and all-good. From a monotheistic perspective, then, it’s necessary that anything in nature be good, too. It’s for precisely this reason that the existence of suffering in nature poses a classic theological problem that philosophers of religion still discuss to this day (Murray 2008). Though belief in God has waned, it remains true that monotheism played a significant role in shaping the conceptual framework we’ve inherited. For example, G.E.M. Anscombe famously argued that the concept of moral duty is a remnant of sorts, one that (according to her, at least) is metaethically awkward without a divine being who legislates moral laws that we’re obligated to follow (Anscombe 1958). Similarly, we often speak of nature as if it contains purpose and structure, all of which seems rather awkward without a divine architect. That wilderness is best understood as a spiritual value is, to my mind, a highly plausible thesis worthy of further philosophical and historical research.


Anscombe, G.E.M. “Modern Moral Philosophy.” Philosophy 33 (1958): 1-–19. 

Faria, Catia. Animal Ethics in the Wild: Wild Animal Suffering and Intervention in Nature (Forthcoming with Cambridge University Press). 

Johannsen, Kyle. Wild Animal Ethics: The Moral and Political Problem of Wild Animal Suffering (Routledge, 2021).

McCulloch, Steven P. and Michael J. Reiss. “The Development of an Animal Welfare Impact Assessment (AWIA) Tool and Its Application to Bovine Tuberculosis and Badger Control in England.” Journal of Agricultural and Environmental Ethics 30 (2017): 485-–510. 

Murray, Michael J. Nature Red in Tooth and Claw: Theism and the Problem of Animal Suffering (Oxford University Press, 2008).

Sandel, Michael. The Case against Perfection: Ethics in the Age of Genetic Engineering (Belknap Press, 2007).