Wilfrid Sellars: Fusing the Images

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Jay F. Rosenberg, Wilfrid Sellars: Fusing the Images, Oxford University Press, 2007, 331pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199214556.

Reviewed by Willem A. deVries, University of New Hampshire


It is a bittersweet opportunity to review Jay Rosenberg's last book, for the opportunity to re-read older essays on Sellars and then to grapple with Jay's most recent work is a pleasure, a challenge, but also a reminder of what might have been. I have thought for many years that Rosenberg is one of the most underappreciated philosophers around. His writing is really first-rate: clear, well-structured, with an excellent sense of expository order and style, a keen eye for the joints of a philosophical dialectic, and a nose for cogent argument. Though Rosenberg has made major contributions to our understanding of Kant, Wittgenstein, and Sellars, he has never been principally an exegete. His systematic books exhibit a sharp analytic intellect supporting an encompassing and synthetic vision of philosophy and its place in the world. Since hooking up with Oxford University Press, Rosenberg has achieved a deservedly more prominent position in contemporary philosophy, and one would have hoped for even greater achievement and recognition once he left behind the important but time-consuming duties of teaching and (for a long time) chairing his department. Alas, cancer caught Jay just as he was retiring from teaching, and we will all be the poorer for his relatively early demise. As astute and sharp as he could be in philosophical argument, he was a friendly, supportive, sociable person, whom his colleagues, students, and friends remember warmly. My path crossed Jay's sporadically for 35 years, and he was unfailingly generous, encouraging, constructively critical, and affable. Jay ends his 'Preface' in this book by saying that "When you read this, I will be emeritus. A good time to think about closure, and about whatever comes next." Final closure came too soon; would that there were something next to come.

Wilfrid Sellars has been the center of increasing attention lately. Some of that attention is generated by Sellars's erstwhile colleagues at Pittsburgh, Robert Brandom and John McDowell. Brandom and McDowell both claim Sellars as a seminal influence, though both seek, in different ways, to correct (different) errors they find in Sellars's work. But not all of the attention is generated in Pittsburgh: Richard Rorty did a great deal to keep Sellars's name alive through a relatively fallow period immediately after Sellars's death. Daniel Dennett, Michael Williams, Ruth Millikan, the Churchlands, David Rosenthal, Bruce Aune, and Dieter Henrich are among the leading philosophers who acknowledge a strong debt to Sellars. Philosophical prominence, however, requires significant opponents as well, and Roderick Chisholm, Roderick Firth, William Alston, Ernest Sosa, Bas van Fraassen, and Robert Gordon have recognized a worthy opponent in Sellars. There is an expanding new generation of philosophers, both here and in Germany, for whom Sellars is a core figure. All of these people find in Sellars a profound and systematic approach to central philosophical issues that inspires further thought, whether for or against.

Most of the prominent philosophers named above have engaged Sellars's work for their own purposes, and have given Sellars's difficult texts readings that subserved those purposes. Rosenberg himself played off Sellars's work in similar fashion in his own systematic works. But there is another face to Rosenberg: for over 30 years Rosenberg has been one of the most reliable and certainly most readable interpreters (and defenders) of Sellars. This is the guise in which we see Rosenberg operating in this book. There is talk now of "right-wing" and "left-wing" Sellarsians, where the difference seems to focus on whether one accepts Sellars's "scientia mensura": "In the dimension of describing and explaining the world, science is the measure of all things, of what is that it is, and of what is not that it is not" (Sellars, "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind," §41). Right-wing Sellarsians maintain and defend Sellars's scientific realism, while the left wing thinks that this is a doctrine that can be pried loose from other important Sellarsian insights and left to rot on the vine. (Notice the interesting inversion from the predecessor distinction between right-wing Hegelians, who were theologically inclined, ill-disposed towards the empirical sciences, and anti-materialistic, and left-wing Hegelians, who thought of themselves as materialists and scientific thinkers.) Rosenberg counts as a right-wing Sellarsian in this regard, and he is certainly a conservative Sellarsian in the sense that he defends Sellarsian doctrines rejected by other epigones. (Personally, I think the "right-wing/left-wing" labels are simplistic, as are a number of interpretations of the scientia mensura, but that's for another day.)

Criticism of Sellars is not absent in Rosenberg's book (cf., e.g., "Perception vs. Inner Sense: A Problem about Direct Awareness"), but the thrust of the thirteen essays collected here (three of which are previously unpublished, the others gathered from a variety of not always easily accessed venues) is generally to clarify and defend Sellars. Anyone who has grappled with Sellars's difficult essays appreciates the clarity of Rosenberg's explications. For brief overviews of Sellars's complex philosophy, the title and lead essay, "Fusing the Images: Nachruf for Wilfrid Sellars," and "Wilfrid Sellars's Philosophy of Mind" (#7 in the collection) are hard to beat. "The Elusiveness of Categories, the Archimedean Dilemma, and the Nature of Man: A Study in Sellarsian Metaphysics" is a more expansive piece that focuses particularly on some of the Kantian aspects of Sellars's scientific realism and linguistic nominalism. ("Linguistic nominalism" might seem redundant, but it is not: it emphasizes the priority of overt, public language.) This essay sets the larger picture for Rosenberg's critical engagement with Sellars: it is both a clear exposition of the basic structures of Sellarsian metaphysics and the first formulation of Rosenberg's own criticisms. Rosenberg is worried, first, that Sellars cannot adequately defend his nominalistic categorial theory:

The rock-bottom categorial distinctions of ontology cannot be elucidated by metalinguistic ascent because the truth of the very metalinguistic claims proposed as analyses of the material mode ontological theses ultimately presupposes the very distinction putatively drawn by those theses. (62)

Second, Rosenberg has qualms that Sellars cannot use the notion of picturing in the way he wants to evade the standard criticisms of Peirce's theory of truth.

Rosenberg returns in greater depth to issues concerning scientific realism in "Comparing the Incommensurable: Another Look at Convergent Realism," distinguishing two different senses of convergence, only one of which might be satisfactory in the context. In "Linguistic Roles and Proper Names" Rosenberg works out a Sellarsian treatment of names that runs distinctively against the Kripkean grain (and that Davidsonians should find sympathetic). The ideas he formulates here were later worked out more fully in his book Beyond Formalism: Naming and Necessity for Human Beings. In "Ryleans and Outlookers: Wilfrid Sellars on 'Mental States'" Rosenberg defends Sellars, as the grandfather of the "theory theory" of psychological knowledge, from an attack by the simulationist Robert Gordon. Gordon claims that Sellars's well-known myth about a primitive community of "Rylean" behaviorists among whom arises a genius, the infamous Jones, who proceeds to develop radically new (and better) explanations of their behavior in terms of posited internal episodes, makes third-person mental reports prior to first-person reports in such a way as to generate paradoxes. Rosenberg argues that a more adequate understanding of Sellars's myth and the lessons drawn from it disarms Gordon's complaint entirely.

Sellars is difficult, and the most difficult part of Sellars's philosophy is his treatment of the sensory. Progenitor of the functionalist treatment of the intentional, Sellars knew 40 years before Chalmers pointed it out that the "hard problem" of the sensory would not succumb to functionalist treatment. The sensorium-body problem required a completely different tack. His analysis of this problem led him to the notion that the empirical sciences will eventually have to postulate primitive, basic entities, sensa, which do not occur outside of the context of a complex sentient being, to account for the phenomena of sense. Sellars argued for these claims in a number of opaque papers, finally in his Carus Lectures. "The Place of Color in the Scheme of Things: A Roadmap to Sellars's Carus Lectures" is a brilliant attempt to make sense of Sellars's arguments. Rosenberg's ability to pull out of a set of obscure texts an organizing problematic and a complex set of distinctions and arguments aimed to resolve this problem and then lay this all out in a coherent exposition is never more in evidence. In "Perception vs. Inner Sense: A Problem about Direct Awareness," however, Rosenberg poses a problem for Sellars's treatment of the sensory. Sellars focuses so much on the treatment of the proper and common sensibles in perceptual contexts, Rosenberg argues, that he has difficulty with pain.

"Still Mythic After all Those Years: On Alston's Latest Defense of the Given" criticizes William Alston's latest attempt to preserve the notion of the given in the face of Sellars's critique. Rosenberg convincingly exposes several conflations and confusions in Alston's argument, particularly in Alston's treatment of looks. The proper treatment of 'looks' and 'sees,' particularly the authority such states possess, is also the focus of "Sellarsian Seeing: In Search of Perceptual Authority." Rosenberg takes on the other two major epigones of Sellars, McDowell and Brandom, who are both unhappy, in different ways, with Sellars's account of perceptual justification. McDowell wants badly to escape the Cartesian picture of mind as an inner world that epistemic principles somehow allow us to reach beyond. Since McDowell equates the mental with the "logical space of reasons," this means that McDowell thinks that the world gives us reasons and not just causes for belief. McDowell thinks Sellars is still caught in the Cartesian picture, precisely because Sellars insists that reasons and causes can come apart. In Rosenberg's Sellarsian eyes, though, McDowell ultimately both misconstrues the ontology of the normative and falls back into the myth of the given, however vociferously he denounces it. Brandom, on the other hand, advocates a moderate externalism in which third-person attributions of knowledge are in principle wholly sufficient. This stands in contrast to the Sellarsian position in which a first-person claim (of some kind) to knowledge is also necessary. Rosenberg argues that Brandom's externalism encounters just the kind of counterexamples one would expect, and that Sellars's externalism-with-a-strong-internalist-condition is just the right kind of fix for the difficulties encountered.

Three of the essays included in the book are new, and, of course, they deserve careful attention. One, "Sellars and Quine: Compare and Contrast," is just what its title intimates, and, not surprisingly, Rosenberg gives the advantage to Sellars over Quine. Quine, he argues, though a far more gifted stylist than Sellars, is fundamentally a critic. Quine argues we can do without universals, propositions, intentions, de re modalities, meanings, synonymy, determinate reference, categorial ontology, and normative epistemology. For Quine the paradigmatic philosophical successes are eliminative analyses. But Sellars, as Rosenberg sees him, is a constructive philosopher. He is as committed to naturalism as Quine, but not via a homogenizing holism that eliminates everything potentially in tension with naturalism. In contrast to Quine's very thin conception of experience as the irradiation of our sensory surfaces, Sellars employs a rich notion of experience as itself making claims. Sellars also rejects Quine's unitary treatment of abstracta and empirical theoretical entities, because our contact with empirical theoretical entities is causal, whereas our contact with abstracta cannot be. Perhaps most interestingly here, Rosenberg discusses some inadequacies in Carnap's approach to semantics that led Quine to his famous skepticism about meanings but led Sellars in a very different direction, namely, to his theory of meaning as functional classification. The final and ultimate disagreement between Quine and Sellars that Rosenberg discusses concerns the fact/norm distinction, for, in the end, Quine makes no room for normativity, whereas Sellars thinks that making room for normativity is imperative. This essay would be well worth assigning in a class in 20th Century Anglo-American Philosophy that required students to read (inter alia) both "Two Dogmas" (or Word and Object) and "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind."

"Sellarsian Picturing" returns to an issue on which Rosenberg had earlier criticized Sellars, namely the notion that (1) there must be a relation of picturing between any empirically meaningful language and the world of which it speaks and that (2) this picturing relation is criterial for the truth of the basic singular statements of the language. Picturing is supposed to be a certain kind of isomorphism between the structures exhibited by occurrences of natural linguistic objects and the structures of the occurrence of objects in the world. It is inspired by Wittgenstein's notion in the Tractatus, but Sellars thought Wittgenstein was wrong to claim that facts picture facts: in Sellars's conception picturing is a relation between (natural linguistic) objects and other objects in the world. Earlier in his career Rosenberg rejected Sellars's notion, arguing that it (1) could not accommodate theoretical entities and (2) could not play the epistemic role he thought Sellars assigned it. Rosenberg here retracts these criticisms, for (utilizing some later work by Sellars) he can now make sense of (a) how it is possible to picture a theoretical entity and (b) how the picturing relation can be criterial for truth without begging epistemic questions. Rosenberg's new conclusion is that Sellars's notion of picturing is defensible, but also less radical and significant than he had originally supposed.

The final essay "Divergent Intuitions: McDowell's Kant and Sellars' Kant" takes up the complex relations between Kant, Sellars, and McDowell, particularly as embodied in McDowell's Woodbridge lectures. Sellars finds a significant ambiguity in Kant's conception of intuition. On the one hand, Kant uses the term to talk about certain immediate, nonconceptual representations of individuals, which he also calls sensations (Empfindungen); on the other hand, Kant clearly applies the term to immediate but concept-laden representations of individuals that Sellars suggests have the form "this-such". Sellars argues that an adequate theory of perception needs to clarify and reinforce this distinction, which becomes central to his own thinking. McDowell, however, complains (1) that there is no such ambiguity in Kant's text, and (2) that for a satisfactory treatment of perception we don't need to countenance any non-cognitive impressions that play the transcendental role Sellars gives them, namely guiding the flow of conceptual representations. Rosenberg does not spend much time on Kant exegesis, though it is clear that he thinks the distinction Sellars sees is there in Kant's text. Most of the essay is spent in careful treatment of McDowell's claims and Sellars's countervailing arguments, particularly Sellars's treatment of the productive imagination in his late essay "The Role of the Imagination in Kant's Theory of Experience". The issues are too complex to be refereed here, but Rosenberg's conclusion is that Sellars's two-stage story allows him to explain two things that McDowell has to leave mysterious: (1) why the same concepts are appropriately called into play in a seeing and a merely ostensible seeing; (2) what those concepts are doing in the case of the merely ostensible seeing. I find Rosenberg's critique of McDowell trenchant.

This book will be indispensable for those interested in Sellars and his Pittsburgh descendants. But it contains a great deal of good philosophy that will be profitably chewed upon by anyone interested in fundamental issues in metaphysics and epistemology. I do so wish that Jay had been able to stick around and write more things like these essays!