Wilfrid Sellars, Idealism, and Realism: Understanding Psychological Nominalism

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Patrick J. Reider (ed.), Wilfrid Sellars, Idealism, and Realism: Understanding Psychological Nominalism, Bloomsbury, 2016, 196pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474238939.

Reviewed by David Pereplyotchik, Kent State University


Wilfrid Sellars was one of the 20th century's most important and influential Anglophone philosophers. This volume joins Rosenberg (2007), deVries (2009), Brandom (2015), O'Shea (2007, 2016), Olen (2016), and Pereplyotchik and Barnbaum (2017) as books in the last decade that critique, extend, and celebrate his work. What sets this collection apart is its thematic focus on a view that Sellars dubbed "Psychological Nominalism" (PN), explained in the key passages below.

(PN1) Platonism is, . . . in its essence, a thesis in the psychology of the higher processes; . . . to reject it is to be what I shall call a psychological nominalist. . . . I shall use the term "Psychological Nominalism" to stand for the denial of the claim . . . that a "perception" or "awareness" of abstract entities is the root mental ingredient of mental acts and dispositions. In other words, the psychological nominalist argues that it is in principle possible to describe and causally account for the episodes singled out by such sentences as "John believes that it is raining" without positing a "perception" or "awareness" of abstract entities. (EAE, 442-5)

(PN2) [P]sychological nominalism [is] the thesis that linguistic phenomena can, in principle, be described and causally accounted for without using semantical or prescriptive expressions. (EAE, 465)

(PN3) . . . a view the general type which I will call psychological nominalism, according to which all awareness of sorts, resemblances, facts, etc., in short, all awareness of abstract entities -- indeed, all awareness even of particulars -- is a linguistic affair. According to it, not even the awareness of such sorts, resemblances, and facts as pertain to so-called immediate experience is presupposed by the process of acquiring the use of language. (EPM, §29)

(PN4) I wish to emphasize, therefore, that as I am using the term, the primary connotation of 'psychological nominalism' the denial that there any awareness prior to, or independent of, the acquisition of language. (EPM, §31)

The contributions to the volume see PN as entwined with different aspects of Sellars' philosophy. Focusing on PN1, some emphasize its metaphysical implications -- the nonexistence and explanatory impotence of abstracta. Others see Sellars' anti-foundationalist epistemological claims embodied in PN3. Still others focus on the bits about language, tying PN to Sellars' semantic thesis that the meaning of an expression is the functional role it plays in a norm-governed social practice. Finally, some see in PN a reflection of Sellars' "critical realism", according to which perceptual awareness involves both sensations and conceptually structured judgments. Seen in this way, PN is a core tenet of German idealism. But Sellars embraces a seemingly opposing view -- scientific realism. Thus, as the volume's title suggests, two central questions are whether Sellars' commitment to PN is consistent with his brand of scientific realism, and whether the combined package is preferable to some version of German idealism.

Patrick J. Reider's introduction sets out the main themes, dovetailing with the discussion in O'Shea's opening chapter. Both contrast Sellars' view with traditional rationalism, according to which our intellect "intuits" real abstracta, and traditional empiricism, according to which our minds unproblematically "abstract" general ideas from sensation. Sellars points out the error common to both views: a pre-linguistic child is not innately -- not even dimly -- aware of the logical space that we inhabit. Concepts are acquired with the mastery of language.

Reider emphasizes Sellars' concept holism, according to which acquiring any one concept involves learning to play language games that incorporate arbitrarily many other concepts. Concept acquisition thus cannot proceed in an atomistic fashion, nor consist in an instantaneous cognitive transformation or gestalt. According to PN, concept acquisition is temporally extended, materially embodied, socially mediated, normatively governed, and holistically structured. Sellars' view is thus the precursor of the Pittsburgh school's normative functionalism, according to which concept use is constitutively governed by social norms that require, permit, and forbid certain inferences (Brandom, 1994; 2015).

The guiding question of O'Shea's essay is how precisely to square PN with Sellars' views on normativity. One of Sellars' ablest exponents, O'Shea offers a characteristically lucid discussion of Sellars' views on abstracta and intentionality. He argues that while Richard Rorty, John McDowell, and Brandom have all focused on the epistemic and semantic aspects of PN -- anti-foundationalism and inferentialism, respectively -- Sellars actually intended PN as metaphysical plank in his defense of a Kant-corrected naturalistic empiricism. This debate is one battleground in the ongoing agon between Left- and Right-wing Sellarsians.

O'Shea notes that Rorty uses PN to defend the doctrines of "epistemological behaviorism", "epistemological holism," and, ultimately, "pragmatism". Rorty connects PN to the idea that knowledge is a socio-normative status, and justification an essentially social matter. Thus, on Rorty's reading, PN is not a theory of "how the mind works," nor of how concepts are acquired or what they are. It's a point about awareness being a socio-normative affair. Seen this way, PN entails a wholesale rejection of epistemology and of the very idea of "answering to the world". McDowell takes a different route. According to PN, perceptual awareness requires the use of concepts. Unable to see how concepts can get a grip on an unconceptualized world, McDowell concludes that "the conceptual has no outer boundary". This is of a piece with Brandom's "modal realism", according to which an object's having one property entails its having others, and precludes it from having still others. Both views invite the label "idealism", but attempt to accommodate realist intuitions by insisting that we do not choose what we perceive, and that no thinker or community is the final arbiter of truth. Most importantly, while, in McDowell's words, "thought and the world must be understood together", it plainly isn't the case that the world only came into existence with the advent of thought!

O'Shea points out that none of these views is recognizable in Sellars' remarks about PN. Indeed, none of (PN1)-(PN4) even mentions normativity, except (PN2), which points away from it. Contra Rorty, O'Shea points out that Sellars did intend PN as an account of "how the mind works" (in one sense of that phrase). And contra Brandom and McDowell, O'Shea argues persuasively that Sellars aimed to give an account of language that preserves both his insights about normativity and his naturalist commitments, reflected in (PN2). The resulting view is a "naturalism with a normative turn," in O'Shea's memorable phrase, which allows us to ascribe meanings to sign-designs by reference to their normative roles in social practices, but also to explain in purely causal terms how such social practices arose. O'Shea is unsure about whether Sellars can pull all this off; but he is confident that the Right-wing interpretation best captures Sellars' meaning. He marshals as evidence two passages from Sellars' later papers (BLM, MEV), where Sellars explicitly recognizes a type of pre-linguistic awareness, and endorses the idea that the (non-social) normative framework of evolution is sufficient to underpin a kind of representation -- a theme that deVries develops more fully, later in the volume.

Paul Redding and Ray Brassier both take on a different issue -- the reality of psychological states. Both are concerned to pit Rorty and Brandom against Sellars and Hegel, arguing that the latter pair, unlike the former, were realists about the mind. It quickly becomes clear that what Redding and Brassier are really after is the claim that Sellars made the world safe for "sense-impressions" and "phenomenal properties". Both arguments are stimulating, but ultimately unconvincing.

If PN is true, then awareness of one's own mental states is not intrinsic to those states. Sellars tells a mythical story, where a genius, Jones, teaches "our neo-Rylean ancestors" folk psychology -- the ability to ascribe thoughts and sensations to themselves and others. Redding asks: "Are we to think that with the capacity to describe themselves and others as having mental lives, the neo-Ryleans thereby come to have such lives?" (42) His taxonomy of the possible answers is puzzling. He takes an affirmative answer to be a kind of realism. But this would amount to saying that our coming to have new descriptive practices can suffice to bring into the world something that wasn't there before -- a view that deserves the label 'idealism', not 'realism'. Equally puzzling is Redding's use of Daniel Dennett's view as an uncontroversial example of anti-realism. True, Dennett does say that we talk about each other as if we have beliefs. But on his view, what it is for one to have a belief is for it to be appropriate for someone (even oneself) to ascribe that belief. And this is the same as saying that "with the capacity to describe themselves and others as having mental lives, the neo-Ryleans thereby come to have such lives". So if Redding takes affirmation of that claim to be a mark of realism, then Dennett should come out a realist. This problematic setup somewhat obscures the import of Redding's essay. But let's set that aside.

On Redding's interpretation, Rorty is an anti-realist about phenomenal properties, and Brandom's "two-ply" account of perception leaves out something important; the first ply consists of nothing more than "reliable discriminative response dispositions," while the second ply consists of intentional states, dispositions to assert, and the undertaking or withholding of discursive commitments. Nowhere to be found are the "sense-impressions" that genius Jones posited after he got done positing thoughts. By contrast, Redding notes, Hegel and Sellars both distinguish thoughts from sensations and retain a realist attitude toward each. In this connection, Redding takes issue with Brandom's claim that subatomic particles in a cloud chamber are directly observable. Brandom reasons that they are the objects of noninferential reports, wrung from us by our sensory discrimination of the activities in the cloud chamber. Redding finds it counterintuitive to say that such things are observable, especially when the observer cannot answer the question, "What did it look like?" But 'observation' is a technical term for Brandom, so ordinary-language intuitions cut no ice. And, besides, the observer can answer, "It looked like the tip of a fast-moving streak in the cloud chamber."

Redding goes on to relate this debate about observation to the de dicto/de re distinction, pointing out that, whereas Rorty and Brandom see de dicto as primary and de re as derivative, Sellars likely held the opposite view. But Brandom's sophisticated discussion of this topic (1994: ch. 8) locates theorists on not just one dimension, but three: (i) primary/derivative; (ii) belief vs. belief ascription; (iii) epistemically strong/weak. Redding assumes without argument that the de dicto/de re distinction is between different kinds of belief or content, rather than between kinds of belief ascription -- a view that Brandom rejects.

Both Redding and Brassier claim that Sellars' "commentary" on Jones' model of thoughts as inner sentences involves a rejection of the existence of any physical, non-representational properties of thoughts. But while it's true that Sellars denied that thinking involves "wagging [an] inner tongue" (EPM), he also held -- as Brassier himself later notes -- that the states in question can be identified with neural events. And these plainly do have non-representational properties.

Brassier goes on to argue that (pace Dennett) Sellars attributed "ultimate homogeneity" to sense-impressions not because he introspectively discovers it in them -- a matter of empirical phenomenology -- but because he thinks of colors themselves as having the (higher-order) property of being homogenous; the "formal analogy" between colors and sensory qualities requires that the latter be ultimately homogenous as well. But this interpretation seems to leave Sellars without any ground for the premise that colors are ultimately homogenous.

Like O'Shea, deVries argues that "the real motivation" (88) behind PN is metaphysical: abstracta must be embodied in order to causally explain anything. After drawing some careful distinctions between types of norms and their corresponding "ought-to-be's" and "ought-to-do's", he argues that PN prevents Sellars from fully embracing a literal ascription of teleological properties to organisms and their parts. DeVries goes on to suggest that Sellars was too Kantian in his thinking, adopting an "intentional" model of teleology, which sees mind as the basis of purpose. He recommends following Hegel, not into idealism, but into the recognition of a teleology prior to, and more basic than, intentionality. Hegel argued that embodied self-realization -- a material pattern that is productive of itself -- grounds a teleology that requires no intentions, only self-replication. Darwinism, too, sees failure to self-replicate as a pathology. This leads deVries to a picture of a naturalistic teleological normativity; intentionality becomes a matter of the organism's embodied practical dealings with the world.

DeVries is right that Sellars should have been a realist about natural teleology. Adding an extra level of "low-grade" normativity helps to bridge the gap between mere material conformity to rules and intelligent rule-following. In Pereplyotchik and Barnbaum 2017 (ch. 5), I argued that Sellars should recognize still further intermediate levels, drawing on insights from the cognitive sciences. I am now convinced by deVries' argument that my reading of Sellars, as fully comfortable with teleology, was incorrect; evidently, I read more of my own views into Sellars than I had thought. Good to know.

The papers in the volume's second half tackle the complex relations between Sellars and German idealism. As Reider and others point out, Sellars followed Kant in claiming that (i) all knowledge requires concepts, which are mental constructs that enable self-awareness and judgment; (ii) that no empirical knowledge is possible without a conceptual framework in place that enables judgments to have determinate content; and (iii) that conceptualization requires synthesizing sensory contents into coherent units in space and time. Sellars also shares with Hegel the rejection of the Myth the Given, a commitment to conceptual holism, and the claim that self-awareness is acquired on the basis of other-awareness. But while many of these views are associated with an idealist perspective, Sellars argues for scientific realism ('SR'). The papers in this section examine whether his commitment to both PN and SR is tenable.

Joseph Margolis burdens the reader with unnecessarily florid prose and excessively long sentences. The meandering style and lack of structure significantly obscure the argument. His principal contention appears to be that Sellars' main themes in PSIM are too "cartoonish" to be taken at face value, and are best seen as "theatrics" of one kind or another, intended to underscore the true lesson of EPM -- that SR is untenable and that the scientific image can never overtake the manifest image, because the former originated in the latter. The argument is spurious, as Haag's paper later in the volume in effect makes clear. Similar remarks go for Tom Rockmore's contribution, whose main claims about Sellars and Brandom betray a lack of familiarity with core texts from both authors. These two papers were the low point of the volume.

In stark contrast, Johannes Haag offers an ingenious and original argument to the effect that Kant's transcendental idealism is superior to Sellars' SR. Haag shows that Sellars rejects the transcendental difference between spatiotemporal properties and, e.g., color only at the cost of a workable notion of an "object of experience" that can guide our conceptualizations and thus permit objective empirical knowledge. Sellars fills the gap with "successor" objects, shored up by the natural sciences (perhaps only at the limit of inquiry). Haag argues that Kant's transcendental "bifurcation" of colors and spatiotemporal properties allows him to retain a viable notion of an "object of experience" and to more firmly reject the Myth of the Given. Though impressed by the depth and clarity of his work, I was unconvinced by Haag's rendering of Kant's argument for the bifurcation, and by the purported advantage of Kant's view with regard to givenness.

In the closing piece, Reider argues that PN entails SR, but goes on to claim that SR falls prey to Hilary Putnam's arguments for "conceptual relativism". This is an interesting thesis, but Reider seems to assume that Sellars has no cogent reply to Putnam's arguments. I think Sellars' views on conceptual change may well provide the resources for such a reply. It also wasn't clear to me that the examples Reider discusses illustrate the kind of conceptual relativity he's after. Reider concludes that Sellars' vexed notion of "picturing" is incapable of solving the problems that Sellars uses it to address, thus shedding further doubt on its usefulness and coherence.

The essays in this volume vary in quality. Some exhibit the virtues that one looks for in such a collection -- a clear statement of Sellars' views, a fruitful comparison with Kant or Hegel, a successful argument in favor of a novel thesis -- but few of the essays exhibit them all, and some exhibit none. The contributions by O'Shea and deVries would be useful as primary readings in a graduate seminar on Sellars, but I would recommend the volume as a whole only to seasoned researchers whose focus lies at the intersection of German idealism and Sellars scholarship.


Brandom, R. B. (1994). Making it Explicit, HUP.

_______, R. B. (2015). From Empiricism to Expressivism: Brandom Reads Sellars, HUP.

DeVries, W. A. ed. (2009). Wilfrid Sellars, Empiricism, Perceptual Knowledge, Normativity, and Realism, OUP.

O'Shea, J. R. (2007). Wilfrid Sellars: Naturalism with a Normative Turn, Polity.

 _______, J. R. ed. (2016). Wilfrid Sellars and His Legacy, OUP.

Olen, P. (2016). Wilfrid Sellars and the Foundations of Normativity, Palgrave Macmillan.

Pereplyotchik, D. and Barnbaum, D. R., eds. (2017). Sellars and Contemporary Philosophy, Routledge.

Rosenberg, J. (2007). Wilfrid Sellars: Fusing the Images, OUP.

Sellars, W. (1956) [EPM] "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind," Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. I, eds. H. Feigl and M. Scriven, pp. 253-329.

_______  (1962) [PSIM] "Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man" Frontiers of Science and Philosophy, ed. Robert Colodny, University of Pittsburgh Press: pp. 35-78.

_______  (1963) [EAE] "Empiricism and Abstract Entities," The Philosophy of Rudolph Carnap, ed. P.A. Schilpp, Open Court.

_______ (1980) [BLM] "Behavior, Language, and Meaning," Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 61: p. 3-30.

_______ (1981) [MEV] "Mental Events" Philosophical Studies, 39: pp. 325-45.