Wilfrid Sellars: Naturalism with a Normative Turn

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James R. O'Shea, Wilfrid Sellars: Naturalism with a Normative Turn, Polity Press, 2007, 256pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745630038.

Reviewed by Thomas C. Vinci, Dalhousie University


Part I

If this book is a fair example of the quality of publications in the series Key Contemporary Thinkers then this is an outstanding series. It is also a handsome volume, with thick, white pages, and clear, good-sized print, easy to read and a pleasure to hold. Not only does this book present a comprehensive picture of Sellars's philosophical system in its breadth, its depth and subtlety, it does so with a freshness and lucidity that I have not seen before in commentaries on Sellars, including my own. One senses O'Shea's enthusiasm for certain of Sellars's ideas, and his admiration for the philosopher himself, but without the partisanship (for one's own readings of Sellars's accounts as well as for the accounts themselves) that one often sees in North American scholarship on Sellars. The author is a Senior Lecturer in Philosophy at the University College Dublin, away from the North American hotbeds of Sellarsiana (such as there are), not himself a student of Sellars, which perhaps accounts for this.

As O'Shea sees it, Sellars's central idea, and most ground-breaking work, is what he calls "naturalism with a normative turn."[1] This idea "involves tracing our deepest philosophical perplexities to questions concerning the complex relationships between the normative and the natural, between reasons and causal uniformities" (177) and is composed of three "tightly connected, fundamental themes":

(a) The crucial role throughout Sellars' philosophy of what I have called his 'norm/nature meta-principle': namely, that the espousal of principles is reflected in uniformities of performance. (TC, 216)[2]

(b) Sellars' repeated contention that all of the various normative conceptual principles at the 'higher levels,' so to speak, convey, imply or presuppose but do not directly assert that various specific natural uniformities, behavioral patterns, reliable causal connections, and structural mappings at the 'lower levels' are either in place or in process. The result is that meaning, truth, intentionality, etc., are shown to systematically presuppose, but are not themselves, real 'relations to the world.' And finally, as arising out of both of those:

(c) The resulting conception of the normative phenomena that constitute the form of our cognitive human experience as being both conceptually irreducible and yet causally reducible to the various physical processes out of which they are constituted. These normative or 'epistemic' phenomena (in Sellars's broad sense of that term) both presuppose (as in (b)) and themselves partly serve to bring about (via (a)) the complex physical processes and patterns in which they are entirely 'realized' in the natural world (see O'Shea 2006b).[3] (177)

O'Shea shows how Sellars deploys these ideas in his theory of language and meaning (in Chapter 3), in his theory of mind and thought (in Chapter 4) and in his epistemology and theory of perception (in Chapter 5). Following a short intellectual biography of Sellars, Chapter 1 begins the main work of the book with an examination of Sellars's seminal and summative work, "Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man." (Sellars, 1963(1)) Chapter 2 develops Sellars's view on science, especially his account of Scientific Realism, and Chapter 7 concerns Sellars's theory of practical reasoning and the nature of what is moral and why we should act in accord with it.

Chapter 1 contains an account of the main developments in "Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man" including the critical "grain argument." This is the argument where Sellars attempts to show that the objects of the common sense world, the "manifest image" in Sellars's terminology, are not identical with any physical object, or system of particles, in the atoms-and-the-void picture of the world maintained by science circa the latter half of the twentieth century. (That this picture is not the only conceivable, or even, in the long run, the best scientific picture of the world is another of Sellars's central doctrines, laid out for us by O'Shea in Chapter 6.) This is a development of Eddington's famous "two tables" analogy, that Sellars reinforced by his (by now equally famous) analogy of the pink ice cubes, a picture of which is the frontispiece of O'Shea's book. O'Shea gives a sympathetic reading of this argument, as he does indeed for all of Sellars's arguments. This is the eliminative theme in Sellars that has been picked up by others, notably Rorty and Paul Churchland, but it is balanced, at least in Sellars, by the doctrine that essential features of the manifest image, including the nature of man and the perceptually obvious features of physical objects (the pink of the pink ice cube), must survive in the ultimate scientific image. This, the "survival theme" as we might call it, is equally important for Sellars and is well accounted for in O'Shea's narrative.

Chapter 2 contains a development of Sellars's account of correspondence rules (there are two types, methodological and substantive) and his case for the existence of theoretical entities. The substantive rules, Sellars argues, establish identities between observable and theoretical (unobservable) entities. The central text for this is "The Language of Theories," especially sections 42 and 43. (Sellars, 1963(4), 121-122) Here Sellars gives his basic argument for the existence of theoretical entities:

Thus, microtheories not only explain why observational constructs obey inductive generalizations, they explain what, as far as the observational framework is concerned, is a random component in their behavior, and, in the last analysis, it is by doing the latter that microtheories establish their character as indispensable elements of scientific explanation and (as we shall see) as knowledge about what really exists. (Sellars, 1963(4), 122)

Sellars has explained this point in the preceding section with help of an (artificial) example concerning the dissolving of gold in aqua regia. Suppose that all gold is observationally indistinguishable but that there is an unpredictable ("random") difference in the dissolving rates of samples placed in the aqua regia. By "unpredictable" I mean that there are no observably detectable factors that explain the difference, either within the gold itself, in the aqua regia or in the environment. Suppose we postulate that there are two different micro-structures to the gold, one of which dissolves at rate x, one at rate x+y, each of which has properties that reinstate the lawfulness of (remove the randomness from) the behavior of gold immersed in aqua regia. This explanation requires the positing of singular, existence-entailing propositions about micro-entities that cannot be treated simply as "inference-tickets" or otherwise dispensable theoretical conditionals.

This idea of Sellars's is novel and seminal, with important implications for a wide range of controversies, for example, concerning the scientific legitimacy of Freudian theoretical postulates of unconscious beliefs and desires. It is true that this idea, as all of Sellars's ideas, has generated controversy and criticism, including an instructive debate with van Fraassen in the 1970's.[4] O'Shea's detailed treatment of Sellars's case for Scientific Realism is on this later debate rather than on the original idea as described above. While it is good to keep readers as current as possible on later developments, I would like to have seen here a primary development that focused on the original case: the reader really does not get a clear idea of the basic picture here.

In Chapter 3 O'Shea gives an account of Sellars's theory of meaning and abstract entities. The various transitions in Sellars's account (on p. 55, for example) are nicely done: in terms of clarity and intuitivity, the account of linguistic meaning in Sellars, centering on the notion of the "dot-quote" style of quotation, tops all of the other excellent accounts. I have really nothing to add (or subtract) from his treatment here.

Chapter 4 is perhaps the heart of the interpretative thesis that O'Shea is advancing: it is here that O'Shea lays out Sellars's development of the normative/natural nexus, the theme that most interests O'Shea about Sellars's work. One of Sellars's most interesting applications of this nexus is to the set of semantical rules that govern appropriate verbal responses to perceptual stimuli ("language entry rules") and to other verbal utterances ("intra-linguistic rules"), and that govern the appropriate actions that follow upon verbalized cognitions ("language exit rules"). Sellars's account depends on a crucial distinction between what we "ought-to-do" and what "ought to be" well explained here by O'Shea. Sellars lays out his account in his "Some Reflections on Language Games" (Sellars, 1963(11)) where he presents a dilemma about the kind of rules to which he thinks semantical rules belong: if we think of them as just regularities of the thunder-lightening kind then we say too little about their normative character but if we treat them as explicit ought-to-dos then we say too much. Semantical rules possess ought-to-be normativity. To explain this status Sellars claims that the cause of the ought-to-be regularities must be actions governed by ought-to-do normativity of the language teachers. All of this is clearly and accurately depicted by O'Shea.

Sellars adapts this idea in an interesting and seminal way in an example with bees in which he argues that the norm of evolutional survival value causes bees to follow the regularities they follow (ought-to bees as it were) in their dances. This is an idea that Millikan picked up and subsequently developed into the evolutionary-historical account of biological function and externalist bio-semantics of much contemporary interest. Those contemporary philosophers who think that Sellars's views on semantics are quaint and outdated need to be reminded of this. Although O'Shea does list Millikan as one of the important contemporary philosophers influenced by Sellars early on in the book, and lists Millikan, 2005 in the references, I would like to have seen a more direct and explicit connection drawn here.

In this same chapter O'Shea gives us Sellars's theory of thoughts as posited entities explained by Sellars in a concept-acquisition myth involving a "Rylean" theoretician, Jones, who sees the need to postulate theoretical entities (inner speech that comprise thoughts) to explain explanatory lacunae in the thoughts-as-overt-speech-dispositions of the Rylean framework. O'Shea does his characteristically good job on all of this, subject to a couple of qualifications. First. Here in the Jones Myth the rationale for postulating theoretical entities of "The Language of Theories" is also at work, something that O'Shea is not in a position to show since, as noted, he has not presented that rationale in Chapter 2. Second. People in the Rylean framework explain action by means of the beliefs and desires of the agent, as we (in the post-Rylean framework) would also do. These beliefs and desires are overtly expressed sentences or speech dispositions and are offered as reasons for action if such is requested or sometimes spontaneously. O'Shea calls such reasons "common-sense psychological explanations" (93) but I think that this may misread Sellars. In the Rylean framework there is no clear understanding of how the mind, even the dispositional mind, causes physical movements that make up behavior. This seems to me to be what the postulated mind accomplishes, it gives us at least the framework in which to eventually implement an answer to this causal question. In the Rylean framework itself the reasons are justificatory reasons: I say "I am hungry and there is food in refrigerator" in order to rationalize and justify my action, not to give a common-sense psychological theory about why I start to move in the direction of the refrigerator. This latter requires something like inner occurrent states that could in principle act as links in a causal chain eventuating in physical movement. These inner states are not present in the Rylean framework prior to the introduction of thoughts. In the adoption of the overt-speech model the reasons for action which occur therein are transposed from rational explanations to causal explanations -- one of two transcategorial transformations Sellars allows between the observational and theoretical arms of the manifest image. (The other is the transformation that occurs in the introduction of the replica model for sense impressions. (EPM, section 61))

Chapter 5 contains O'Shea's account of Sellars's epistemology. Here O'Shea presents the central themes of the argument against the given and presents Sellars's positive epistemology, centering as it does on the non-foundationalist account of inferential knowledge, the groundwork for which is laid in "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind." In his treatment of both of these themes in this work, one senses that O'Shea is dissatisfied with Sellars's handling of them there and moves fairly quickly in each case to later works. Of special importance to O'Shea on the anti-foundationalist theme are the Carus Lectures of 1981 (Sellars, 1981): here O'Shea finds a clearer and more persuasive account. I think one would have to agree with O'Shea that there are problems in exposition, even problems with doctrine, in the EPM treatment of both of these themes. With the positive epistemology it seems to me that treatments in later places involve a clarification and strengthening of the idea that Sellars was originally interested in proposing, but I am not sure that this is the case with the development of the anti-foundational doctrine in the Carus Lectures. In the latter, the myth of the given is called "the myth of the categorially given". Unlike O'Shea I do not see this as a somewhat clearer restatement of the anti-foundationalist argument of EPM but as a version of the argument that marks a considerable departure from the original argument within a trend to accommodation with traditional giventist doctrine in the Carus Lectures as a whole. More important than the question of how things lie with the Carus Lectures is whether O'Shea has uncovered the nerve of the argument in EPM. I think that he has not. In the second part of this article I propose to identify some difficulties that I see in O'Shea's interpretation of the crucial "Trilemma Argument" of EPM (section 6).

Chapter 6 contains an account of Sellars's ontology in which he provides his own solution to the mind-body problem as it would be represented in science as it would (should) occur in the Peircean limit of inquiry. This account, rather speculative even by Sellarsian standards and developed in detail only later in his career (Sellars, 1971, 1981), "has not had a wide influence on contemporary philosophy of mind" (175) as O'Shea somewhat understatingly puts it.

The final chapter, Chapter 7, presents Sellars's ethical theory and is the place where O'Shea's own Sellarsian commitments are most clearly laid out, again, with the care and clarity that has characterized the rest of this book.

Part II

The main argument Sellars makes against the given in section 6 of EPM takes the form of an "inconsistent triad" that is said to affect typical empiricist opponents. This triad is presented by O'Shea (with his interpolation) as follows:

(A) X senses red sense content s entails x non-inferentially knows that s is red.

(B) The ability to sense sense contents [SENSE DATA] is unacquired.

(C) The ability to know facts of the form x is ǿ is acquired. (O'Shea, 114; EPM, 132)

The critical clause is (C): Do empiricists actually hold this, and if they were to, what problem would there be for them to simply drop it, thus breaking the dilemma? Sellars does not offer us a suspect but O'Shea does: H.H. Price. (O'Shea notes that H.H. Price was a tutor of Sellars's when he was at Oxford in 1930's.) O'Shea quotes the famous When-I-see-a-tomato-there-is-much-that-I-can-doubt passage from Perception (Price, 1933, 2-3; O'Shea, 111) suggesting that there is an obvious and undoubtable presence of a "red patch of a round and somewhat bulgy shape." (This is the "sense datum" of clause (B).) But the presence of this bulgy patch to us is not all that is present in consciousness:

What we apprehend is always a fact -- something of the form "that A is B" or "the B-ness of A." You cannot apprehend just A. For instance, you cannot apprehend a round patch without apprehending that it is red and round and has certain spatial relations. (O'Shea, 112; Price, 1932, 7)

There is no indication from this passage that Price would be one to initially accept (C). Unfortunately, neither Sellars nor O'Shea suggest a more likely suspect. But let us bypass this question and just stipulate that someone with empiricist inclinations holds it and the other two clauses. Once it is seen that one's position is inconsistent in this way, why could not an empiricist just abandon (C)? O'Shea's answer is given thus:

To put it in somewhat sweeping historical terms, the empiricist tradition in general defends the view that all factual knowledge derives ultimately from sense experience rather than pure reason. As a result empiricists (and Sellars, too) attempt to give an account of our knowledge that does not rely upon the direct or intuitive grasp of essences, universals or a priori principles … (114)

Be that as it may, it is not clear why this is a decisive reason to stick with the claim that knowledge is acquired: one could deny that persons grasp essences, have innate ideas and the like while also denying that the capacity for basic sensory knowledge is acquired. Price himself may plausibly be proposed as such a person, apparently O'Shea's suggestion for Sellars's target empiricist. So there is a puzzle here in O'Shea's treatment of the Trilemma Argument that needs to be dispelled. My interpretation seeks to dispel it.

O'Shea does not dwell on the Trilemma Argument much longer here, moving on quickly to consider another version of myth of the given, the "myth of the categorial given," stated thus in the Carus Lectures (Sellars, 1981): "If a person is directly aware of an item which has categorial status C, then the person is aware of it as having categorial status C." Sellars states that this is "perhaps the most basic form of what I have castigated as the 'the Myth of the Given'." (Sellars, 1981, 11) According to O'Shea what Sellars means by this is the following:

In accordance with this principle, to reject the myth of the given in its "most basic form" is to hold that there exists no privileged type of direct awareness, whether intellectual insight or sensory receptivity, that has the following revelatory power: simply being directly aware in that way of something x which is in fact of such and such a kind or sort by itself provides one with the direct awareness of x as being of that kind or sort. (115)

One question we need to ask is what range of properties or "sorts" do Sellars's categories cover? If it is just high-level properties of metaphysical status (being a mental process, being a physical process, being independent of mind, etc. -- being a category in Kant's sense) then one could fairly easily accept Sellars's point. Simply by experiencing a red patch that is (let us assume) a mental item we do not thereby know that it is: that something of the sort, red, round -bulgy patch is present to one may be given but its metaphysical status is "taken." No foundationalist with his wits about him would deny this. Indeed, O'Shea affirms as much in a note appearing at the end of the passage just quoted:

This is not to suggest, absurdly, that such accounts of the given attribute to people an explicit awareness of the metaphysical categories under which their experiences fall. Rather, it is to say that such philosophical accounts of what people experience implicitly attribute to those people a direct awareness of what sort of thing it is that they are experiencing, simply in virtue of their undergoing the experience of it. (211)

O'Shea takes the range of "categories" in the myth of the categorial given to cover all sorts of sorts, including red, round and bulgy sorts. If the scope of "categories" is this broad, then the categorial myth is a very broad principle equivalent to the original formulation of the myth in EPM, but if the scope is narrow, applying only to metaphysical categories, say, then the myth of the categorial given is not equivalent to the original myth and is easily disposed of.

O'Shea claims that the scope is broad but I think that a look at texts surrounding section 44 of the Carus Lectures does not bear this out. In the preceding sections (38 ff.) Sellars has been carrying on an installment of his long-standing argument with Firth over the question whether "looks red" is prior to "being red." In section 40 Sellars maintains that it is not, but allows that there may be an "ur-concept" less sophisticated than the concept of a "physical object's being red, without being the concept of something other than a physical object being red." (Sellars, 1981, 10-11) In particular, Sellars insists that "red" (in the manifest image) does not denote an adverbial modifier, a property of an experience rather than an object. This is how he puts the point in section 43, which I quote in full:

Thus the idea that our ur-concept of red is that of a manner of experiencing strikes me as most implausible. I can only account for the fact that philosophers have talked themselves into it by attributing to them the following line of thought:

When a child has an experience of the kind which it is useful to baptize by saying that "O looks red to junior," what is really going on is that O is causing Junior to sense redly. Junior is directly aware of this sensing redly. Therefore, he is aware of it as having a categorial status C. (Sellars, 1981, 11)

Immediately after this passage Sellars formulates the doctrine he calls the myth of the categorial given. It is plain from Sellars's explanation of this doctrine in the passage just quoted that the category in question is a metaphysical category, the category of being a property of an experience rather than of a physical object. So the doctrine of the categorial given is, for Sellars, the doctrine that O'Shea labels as "absurd" in note 18. It is indeed absurd, as Sellars intends us to see immediately, that is why he has wanted to saddle his Firthean opponent with it. What this means is that the original myth, the one that says no knowledge of sorts of any kind, even the oft-mentioned red, round bulgy kind, can be given is a different myth. To refute this myth requires a strong argument offering much more against the empiricist than the simple observation, doubted by no-one, that metaphysical categories are not simply given in experience. Although Sellars rightly claims that pointing out the falsity of the myth of the categorically given (in my sense) is a basic aim of the original argument in EPM, he cannot rightly claim that it is the only aim: there has to be more to the original argument. Unfortunately, O'Shea leaves his readers at sea concerning what that might be.


Sellars, Wilfrid. (1963) Science Perception and Reality, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul. [References to papers that appear as chapters in this volume, for example, chapter 4, p. 109, are referenced thus: "(Sellars, 1963(4), 109)"]

Sellars, Wilfrid. (1976) "Is Scientific Realism Tenable?" (presented at a symposium at the 1976 Philosophy of Science Association Meeting in Chicago). Published in Volume II, Proceedings of PSA: 307-34.

Sellars, Wilfrid. (1981) "Foundations for a Metaphysics of Pure Process," (The Carus Lectures), The Monist 64: 3-90.

Van Fraassen, Bas. (1975) "Wilfrid Sellars on Scientific Realism," Dialogue 14: 606-16.

Van Fraassen, Bas. (1980) The Scientific Image, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] References to the O'Shea book will be page numbers in parentheses. References to "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind" (Sellars, 1963(5)) will be as "EPM." Other references will be in the usual APA style.

[2] This is a reference to "Truth and Correspondence," Journal of Philosophy 59: 29-56. Reprinted in Sellars, 1963(6).

[3] The reference is to O'Shea, James R. (2006) 'On the Structure of Sellars's Naturalism with a Normative Turn,' delivered at University College London, conference in honour of the fiftieth anniversary of Sellars's delivery of the EPM lectures in London. (Available online at: http://philosophy.sas.ac.uk/Empiricism_Mind_Sellars.htm.) Publication forthcoming as of 2007.

[4] See Van Fraasen, 1975; Sellars, 1976; Van Fraassen, 1980.