William James on Democratic Individuality

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Stephen S. Bush, William James on Democratic Individuality, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 238pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107135956.

Reviewed by Eric Thomas Weber, University of Kentucky


Stephen S. Bush takes on the difficult task of building an account of William James's democratic political thought. As Bush notes, a number of scholars have dismissed the idea that James had anything to say politically, with the exception of a few condemnations of lynching. Bush clearly succeeds in rebutting those dismissive of James as a source of political insight. Joshua Miller's Democratic Temperament: The Legacy of William James (1997) similarly demonstrated inspiration we might draw from James for democratic thought, but Bush's project is considerably more ambitious. He claims that James's contribution "is a comprehensive and compelling philosophy for social and political activism" (224). While Bush demonstrates the value of James's insights about democratic individuality, the book's grander arguments about his political theory are less compelling and those about his lessons for political activism ironically ignore the practical realities of political struggle. A more likely success, it seems, could come from the development of a political philosophy inspired by James, yet informed by pragmatic realities of achieving the kind of support for democratic individualism that James usefully clarifies as a goal. At the same time, Bush highlights an important consideration that both James and John Dewey raised for political philosophy that many have underappreciated, namely the crucial role of individuals and culture for democracy. Nevertheless, what James largely failed to connect, and fellow Pragmatist Dewey and others addressed more profoundly, is the relationship between individuals, culture, and the political machinery of democratic societies.

Scholars of the history of American philosophy are likely to be the audience most interested in the book. Those who study individualism may find valuable insight, too, in Bush's presentation of four main qualities of James's democratic individualism. Bush argues that, for James, the individual first and foremost is responsible. Four chapters attend to James's thought on responsibility. A number of passages therein present Bush's strong outlook on democracy, which is rich and interesting in its own right, but some stretch far from James's explicit thoughts. Bush shows that James had a lot to say about truth, naturally, and demonstrates the complexities of James's relation of the individual to responsibility for truth. While Bush expends considerable effort to make his case for James's sense of the role of responsibility for the individual, however, he also acknowledges that "James does not himself utilize the word 'responsibility' prominently" (45). He notes further challenges for studying James for democratic purposes, such as in James's "endorsement of racial supremacy," which Bush calls "objectionable" (82). Although I am a sympathetic reader for Bush's project, the lengths he had to go to make his case for James's democratic political philosophy left me less believing, rather than more. Where Bush shows concern about social justice in interpreting James on responsibility, he appears not to have recognized the James scholars who lean more libertarian than Bush, such as John Lachs, whose profound work in American pragmatism and on William James he never cites. Individuals bear such a responsibility, in James's view, that he rails on institutions, as Bush notes. James at times spoke in favor of socialistic economic arrangements, yet his rejection of institutions is appealing to some of the libertarian individualists whom Bush criticizes repeatedly for their economic conservatism.

One of the fine and novel points Bush makes in the passages about responsibility is perhaps mostly historical, yet also connected with recent scholarship. He highlights ways in which James's moral understanding of demands on others is a precursor to Stephen Darwall's more recent "second-personal" stance in moral theory (99). Ethicists in the Pragmatist tradition and contemporary metaethicists who engage with work like Darwall's might well find fertile ground for enriching present debates with a look at chapter 4, on "Moral Objectivity."

The second aspect of James's democratic individualism that Bush highlights seems to be the most salient: sensitivity to strangers. James and Walt Whitman were both seers in an important democratic sense when it comes to appreciating people who are different. This topic merits further development than the chapter Bush devotes to it, especially in a time when Americans and the world appear to be increasing in xenophobia, anti-immigrant attitudes, and hostility towards refugees and asylum seekers. Bush does contribute valuably here, in noting the ways in which James attended to people and variety in his works on religion, his talks to teachers, and his writing on morality. Here again, however, what we get from James appears mostly to be a kind of illustration of what is wise with respect to holding what Miller called a democratic temperament. It could be shown to have continuous implications in policy for immigration, foreign aid, and the welcoming of refugees and asylum seekers; but to think that James had a robust political philosophy on these matters would be at least overstated. Elsewhere Bush points out a useful practical example for policy in James's opposition to American imperialism in the Philippines, not in connection with sensitivity to strangers, but on James's public writings against authoritarianism.

Bush points out that James's third quality of democratic individualism is meliorism, the "commitment of James and other pragmatists to work actively for the betterment of society" (9). Bush devotes two chapters to this topic, one on "Individuality and Social Change" and one on "Heroes and Citizens." The topic of meliorism is arguably one of the most important in James's work for guiding social and political activism, yet here James underwhelms despite Bush's efforts. At bottom, James was deeply critical of institutions, something that Bush acknowledges as he moves forward nonetheless to suggest that we can draw insights for the rare kind of institution that James might not reject outright. Institutions on James's account are problematic because of the ways they quash individuality. The right kind of democratic institution, Bush explains, is the one that uplifts and enables individuals' different aims. In a sense, this outlook seems definitionally democratic, insofar as the people involved would be empowered, yet it is precisely where James appears the least attentive to pragmatic realities, the great irony in the thought of one of the most famous pragmatists.

Bush notes interestingly that one of the few institutions that James highlights, which can and sometimes even does embrace and empower the individual, is the university. He again acknowledges that at the time James was one of the unbelievably lucky people not only to be college educated, much less common in his day, but also a professor in a top university. Today, with far more widespread access to higher education, James might celebrate that fact, yet the individuality afforded a supremely well supported Harvard professor has little in common with the conditions for non-tenure-track community college instructors teaching five hundred students per semester. His elitism is little diminished in Bush's account of James on heroes or the idea that the value of college is in enabling the discernment of "great men" when choosing leaders.

The idea that institutions would be wise to think about how they can promote individuality is reasonable in many cases. At the same time, when challenges take the form of gerrymandering and voter suppression, inchoate strategies of anti-institutional, individualistic movements like Occupy Wall Street benefit reactionaries. James is so critical of conformity and institutions that his outlook appears to be tragically ineffectual as opposition to coordinated, institutional efforts. Threats are real. Greater individualism with regard to vaccination is presently driving measles epidemics and the advancement of anti-science attitudes in public school curricula. Plato in the Republic explained that smaller and less wealthy but virtuous cities would be strong in defending themselves by appealing to the oppressed in larger cities and stoking division among the more populous and wealthy attackers. Today, it is the wealthy few who have taken this approach to defeating the more populous poor, embracing their opposition's differences and reluctance to conform. In addition, gerrymandering, voter suppression, and fostering division among the progressives, whom Bush favors, have been effective strategies for the conservatives he opposes. And the institutions James might love, colleges and universities, have in so many spheres radically departed from the kinds of arrangements that would be supportive of the development of individuality, as we lean more heavily on standardized testing and dependence upon insecure, contingent employment in higher education. James's goal of wanting to promote individuality can be right even if he seems profoundly unrealistic in his level of criticism of institutional strategy and maneuvering. So long as progressives focus on the ideal while railing against institutions and political machinery, they will be idealistic and ineffective rather than pragmatic.

Bush argues that the fourth quality of James's individualism is religiousness. There is something to this, yet James seems only partly to have focused his thought on the political aspects of religiously democratic character. Something like belief in what is greater, as in Robert Bellah's civil religion or Dewey's common faith, could be a kind of religiosity at work in James's potential political contribution. Yet Bush reveals that for James, despite his flexible and progressive sense of "religion," God is an essential part of the moral life. And, Bush notes that James's religiosity is one of the more controversial aspects of his democratic individualism. Religiosity certainly comes across in the book as the least politically revelatory aspect of James's individualism, save as a kind of potential moral motivator. Nevertheless, Bush notes that "it hardly needs to be pointed out that religion does not always support social justice movements" (214), but actually, it is very important to note just how tragically religion can be put to use for injustice. In places self-identified as the most religious in the country, such as Mississippi,[1] Martin Luther King, Jr.'s famous quip remains true: "the most segregated hour in America is on Sunday morning."[2] James might in response have pointed out that the problem here concerns organized religion and a religious attitude that is itself undemocratic, but that is precisely the point. If James's and others individualistic ideals have been around since the early 1900s, why have individuals not yet succeeded in ameliorating such problems? One plausible answer is that taking an approach overly focused on individualism to the neglect of collaborative institution-building has been pragmatically ineffectual.

As a reviewer, I am sympathetic to and a believer in James, democracy, and many of Bush's values concerning the least fortunate in society. At the same time, focus on the ways in which James's thought bears a democratic character seems more defensible, in Miller's kind of approach, than the claim that James really develops a political philosophy. James is a wonderful and towering thinker, and it is no unpardonable flaw for a philosopher to have focused attention on some subjects rather than others. At the same time, Bush is clearly inspired and rich with ideas about democracy. He might profitably present his case in its own right, supported and inspired by James's philosophy. If he does, however, it would seem essential to address the dynamics of power in employment, and especially unions. When individuals face an insuperable imbalance of power with respect to their employers, institutionalization, unionization, and some conformity and solidarity are sometimes necessary for achieving even partial progress for individuals. James might sign on to some initiatives on the one hand while speaking dismissively about collaborative institutional action on the other. His negative attitude about institutions may be a result of his privilege in not having needed their help.

Perhaps the most fascinating facet of James's democratic individualism, held along with criticism of institutions, is his advocacy for universal public service in "The Moral Equivalent of War,"[3] which Bush acknowledges. Civil service programs are at least as good as colleges and universities are as examples of institutions that develop democratic individualism, given that, though they are institutionalized, they allow for great variety in areas of possible social service and empower people with experience, training, and job opportunities. While some of Bush's broader claims may be overly ambitious, there is little doubt that James was a brilliant and influential figure who brought democratic spirit to the understanding of individualism. His privilege and limited experience likely made it hard for him to appreciate the necessities of unions and institutional solidarity, yet one could well develop a democratic theory attentive to his insights about sensitivity to strangers and great responsibility that every individual should feel for the parts we can each play in considering truth, morality, and justice.

[1] Leichman, Aaron J. "Survey: Nation's 'Most Religious' Population in Mississippi." The Christian Post. December 22, 2009..

[2] Blake, John. "Why Sunday Morning Remains America's Most Segregated Hour." CNN Religion Blog. October 6, 2010.

[3] William James, "The Moral Equivalent of War," in The Writings of William James: A Comprehensive Edition, edited by John J. McDermott (Chicago, IL: The University of Chicago Press, 2000).