William James on Ethics and Faith

Placeholder book cover

Michael R. Slater, William James on Ethics and Faith, Cambridge UP, 2009, 247 pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521760164.

Reviewed by Ellen Kappy Suckiel, University of California, Santa Cruz



Michael Slater has written a valuable, thorough, and thought-provoking book about William James’s views on ethics, religious faith, and the mutually-dependent relations between them. A sensitive interpreter of James, Slater argues that religious belief informs and enriches both theoretical ethics and practical morality in James’s philosophy and, conversely, that considerations about the theoretical status of morality provide a certain form of justification for religious belief.

One of Slater’s central and most significant contentions is that James’s pragmatic account of religion incorporates both an ethical view of the function of religion and a realist view of the objects of religious belief and experience. To establish these claims, he provides a close study of James’s views on ethics and the ethics of belief, including his “will to believe” and “right to believe” doctrines in “The Will to Believe” (Chapters 1 and 2); James’s analysis of the foundation of morality in “The Moral Philosopher and the Moral Life” (Chapter 3); and James’s views of the practical value of religious belief in his less frequently discussed work, “Is Life Worth Living?” (Chapter 4). In Chapter 5, Slater analyzes the relationship between religion and morality in The Varieties of Religious Experience and shows how, in Varieties, James holds that leading a religious life is a requirement of maximal human flourishing. In Chapter 6, he examines James’s pragmatic philosophy more generally, and focuses on James’s epistemological, metaphysical and religious views in Pragmatism, The Meaning of Truth, and Varieties. Here (as he states succinctly in the introduction) Slater argues that

In spite of certain tensions and the occasional inconsistency in his views … James’s pragmatism nevertheless manages to preserve a commitment to metaphysical realism, including a commitment to religious realism (16).

Slater concludes his book with an “Epilogue” that assesses the broader ethical and epistemological implications of James’s ethics and philosophy of religion and points to their relation to those of other, more recent thinkers, such as John Hick, John Rawls, and Robert Audi. He concludes that

the most innovative aspect of James’s philosophy of religion is its attempt to reconcile a commitment to religious realism with what we might call a commitment to religious humanism — that is, to combine a realistic view of the objects of religious belief with the view that human interests and purposes ineluctably shape our conceptions of and manner of relating to those objects (233).

As this summary suggests, Slater’s project is an ambitious one. He analyzes both the substantive tenets of James’s philosophy and its underlying methodological premises and motivations, including James’s most personal philosophical commitments. This is a particularly appropriate approach in a study of James, since — both for philosophical reasons and reasons of personal style — the theoretical and personal are often interdependent in James’s philosophy. Nevertheless, as I shall discuss below, there also times when James insists on their being kept distinct.

It is a mark of both the fecundity of James’s philosophy as well as its flaws that there is room for reasonable disagreement about the nature of his considered views. While I do not have the space in a review of this size to go into detail about my agreements and disagreements with Slater’s interpretations of James, I will briefly discuss those I think are most central to James’s philosophy and to Slater’s understanding of him. The major area of interpretation about which Slater and I disagree concerns the meaning of “realism” in James’s philosophy and the extent to which James is a “realist.” This is a highly controversial topic among James interpreters, having led to numerous opportunities for reply and counter-reply. Slater argues that “James had a metaphysical commitment to religious realism” (12; see also 56-7). He holds that “James thinks that the objects of religious experience really exist, and like all realities their content is not exhausted by the ways in which we take or conceive them” (134), as well as that “James was (1) committed to ”font-style: italic;“>metaphysical realism and (2) that his theory of truth was a type of ”font-style: italic;“>correspondence theory” (185). He therefore rejects interpretations according to which James believes that the truth of religious claims is reducible to their practical value (3). Nevertheless, even in the context of James’s putative realism, Slater sees James as giving a pragmatic justification of religious belief - one which is perspectivalist and humanistic.

The apparent problem with Slater’s interpretation is that it appears to land James directly in a contradiction. For on the face of it, perspectivalism and pragmatism are contradictory to “metaphysical realism,” the view that there are objects and states of affairs that exist prior to and independent of human beliefs about them, and which our beliefs, to be true, must represent. While pragmatism and metaphysical realism seem clearly incompatible, the major contention of Slater’s book is that “James defends and successfully combines a realistic interpretation of religion with a pragmatic religious epistemology” (16). This, of course, is a challenging hypothesis to try to prove. Has Slater succeeded?

One possible way to resolve the apparent incompatibility between “pragmatism” and “realism” is to forgo metaphysical realism, in favor of internal realism, and one way of doing this is to define “realism” and “reality” itself in pragmatic terms. This, I believe is largely what James (at least in his pragmatic writings) attempts to do. Defined pragmatically, “reality,” however independent it may be of any individual thinker at any particular time, is not independent of inquiry on the whole. At important philosophical junctures James argues, following Peirce, that reality, like absolute truth, is solely a regulative ideal, an ideal outcome of inquiry. In my opinion, such a projection of the end point of inquiry is as far as a humanist or pragmatist consistently can go in their understanding of reality as independent of human purpose and belief. It is worth noting, however, that James posited different (if complementary) accounts of reality in his various works. In The Principles of Psychology, he argues that the sole “reality” unaffected by human judgment is the “blooming, buzzing confusion” experienced by infants (PP 462). In Essays in Radical Empiricism, however, he interprets this stream of experience metaphysically, as the sole ultimate reality. In that work, James contends that this underlying reality is metaphysically neutral - neither mental nor physical - and is open to either mental or physical interpretations depending on our purposes and interests. Thus, in Essays in Radical Empiricism, with regard to the status of ordinary empirical objects and events, James can best be categorized as an internal realist.

This having been said, it is worth noting that James does make some metaphysical realist claims in Varieties and elsewhere. I believe that this is attributable to the fact that James personally believed in the existence of a divine reality, a “wider self through which saving experiences come” (VRE 405). I believe, however, contrary to Slater, that although James was trying to do what he could to open up his readers to the possibility of apprehending this reality, he was not trying to philosophically establish the existence of the divine. He acknowledges that this belief in the reality of the divine is his own “overbelief,” i.e., his unproven personal opinion. He also acknowledges that there is no sufficiently conclusive philosophical or empirical proof of God’s existence. Even in his discussion of mystical experience - that experience which James sees as the paradigm of the achievement of religious knowledge — he argues that while the experience of the mystic is, and is justifiably, authoritative over the mystic him/herself, there is no (epistemic or moral) obligation for non-mystics to consider it so (VRE 335-6). The important point to note here is that James is very careful to refrain from making claims about objective religious reality. He makes it a point to concede that what appears to the subject to be an independent divine reality may be nothing more than his/her sub-conscious self (VRE 405). It must be acknowledged, then, that however much James personally believed in a divine reality, and however much he argued that there were situations wherein individuals could be morally and even epistemically justified in holding beliefs about this reality, James himself did not feel philosophically justified in supporting a metaphysical commitment to religious realism.

It should also be noted that James is ambivalent about the epistemic status of religious belief. On some occasions he sees religious belief as being subject to the same confirmation conditions as ordinary empirical or scientific beliefs; on other occasions he argues that a religious system of belief embodies a distinctly different paradigm from a scientific one, and hence that these two systems are not subject to the same truth or justification conditions. What James does not do, in my opinion, is what Slater attributes to him - namely, believe that metaphysical realism and pragmatism are compatible. While Slater sometimes tempers his position by calling James’s commitment to realism a “modest” one (184), I do not discern any sustainable difference, in Slater’s argument, between a modest version of realism and internal realism.

Another section of the book which I found particularly illuminating is Chapter 5, “Religion and Morality in ”font-style: italic;“>The Varieties of Religious Experience.” Slater considers James’s view of the relationship between religion and morality from both psychological (practical) and philosophical (theoretical) perspectives. From a practical standpoint, he argues that for James,

morality cannot be finally separated from religion, because there are moral goods that only religious faith - and in some cases, only the objects of religious faith — can plausibly bring about (7).

I agree with Slater’s contention that James believes that, from a psychological perspective, belief in the existence of God enables believers to approach what they see to be their moral commitments with a seriousness and strenuousness unavailable to non-believers (71). Slater also recognizes that there are genuine metaphysical issues at stake in James’s position, not merely motivational ones. He recognizes that for James in “The Moral Philosopher,” only God’s existence can provide the theoretical and objective grounding required by James’s ethical theory that the good is constituted by the satisfaction of demand. For, as James argues, it is only God who could play the role of a systematic unifier of all sentient beings’ demands. Slater also recognizes that James holds (in apparent contradiction with the position just mentioned) that a naturalistic theory of ethics is possible (though perhaps not fully comprehensive) without God as its foundation. Slater does a very good job considering the subtle relationship between these various positions.

I think it is important to note that no amount of ethical motivation provided by religious belief can provide theoretical support for ethical theory - James’s or anyone else’s. “Religion is the basis of ethics” might be a statement about practical morality, meaning that “being a religious believer is necessary to lead the most ethically committed life,” or it might be a statement about theoretical morality, meaning that “religious propositions provide the foundation for an acceptable normative or meta-ethical theory.” Slater makes the distinction himself between personal ethical commitment and ethical theory (86), but he may not sufficiently acknowledge its implications in trying to understand the relationship between religion and ethics for James. James does indeed personally believe, as is evident in Varieties in particular, that religious believers are likely to lead morally better lives than non-believers, and hence that the consequences of religious belief are on the whole morally salutary. But in Varieties he gives no alternative theoretical foundation of ethical theory on a par with the naturalistic satisfaction of demand theory in “The Moral Philosopher.”

Even if James’s contention that belief in God provides the strongest motivation for living the highest moral life, this by itself would not establish - vis-à-vis the “metaphysics” of morals — that ethical value itself has its foundation in religious or divine realities. Thus, I believe that James’s promotion of Christian values in Varieties remains without theoretical ground in “The Moral Philosopher.”

Among Slater’s book’s many strengths is the completeness with which he shows the many ways in which religion and morality are interrelated in James’s philosophy. While I have expressed some significant disagreements with Slater’s interpretation of James, I have found his analyses to be perceptive and well-considered and his arguments to be painstaking and nuanced. James would particularly approve of the fact that Slater appears to display a salutary personal stake in the issues discussed. This book is well worth reading for its insights into James and the immensity of the task James set for himself, as well as for its demonstration of, and attempt to resolve, a mass of seemingly contradictory tendencies in James’s philosophy. While I do not think that this book rescues James from many of his apparent contradictions, it certainly brings out some of the richest aspects of James’s philosophy and the enigmas it presents. If Slater’s resolution is controversial, that only adds to the fruitfulness of his book as a spur to further research into the problems and promises of James’s philosophy. I should also add: do not skip over the footnotes — they are often very rich.


William James, The Principles of Psychology (PP), The Works of William James, Frederick H. Burkhardt, Fredson Bowers, and Ignas K.Skrupskelis (eds.), Harvard UP, 1981.

William James, The Varieties of Religious Experience (VRE), The Works of William James, Frederick H. Burkhardt, Fredson Bowers, and Ignas K.Skrupskelis (eds.), Harvard UP, 1985.