Williamson on Knowledge

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Patrick Greenough and Duncan Pritchard (eds.), Williamson on Knowledge, Oxford UP, 2009, 400pp., $50.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199287529.

Reviewed by Tim Black, California State University, Northridge



This volume focuses on issues in the epistemology of Timothy Williamson, one of the foremost epistemologists of our day. It contains fifteen essays which are critical of various aspects of Williamson’s epistemology and which have themselves been penned by preeminent epistemologists. The volume also includes responses from Williamson to each of these fifteen pieces. It is chock full of work of the highest caliber, as one would expect from a volume that includes contributions from so many exceptional epistemologists. I shall describe the volume by using, if I may, a military metaphor, a metaphor which I find apposite in this case. At this point, ten years after the publication of Knowledge and its Limits (Oxford University Press, 2000), Williamson’s epistemology — a ‘knowledge-first epistemology’, which, as the editors of the volume say (p. 1), seeks “to reverse the trajectory of much if not all recent thinking in epistemology” by treating “knowledge as primary and [by] elucidat[ing] other notions relevant to epistemology in terms of their relationship to knowledge” — occupies a formidable defensive position. The authors of the essays in this volume engage in attacks on this position, some of which are frontal, posing direct challenges to Williamson’s views, and some of which are flank, arguing that Williamson’s positions are inferior to certain alternatives. Williamson responds to the flanking maneuvers, as well as to some of the frontal attacks, with counterattacks. Against other frontal assaults, he endeavors to stand firm in the position he now occupies. At the end of the day, Williamson sees no reason to quit the field. Indeed, in the face of these attacks, he is reluctant to give any ground at all.

The value of this volume lies in its affording us an opportunity to see where, in the eyes of today’s leading epistemologists, Williamson’s epistemology is weakest, and why they think it’s weakest in those places. There is also value in seeing Williamson respond to his critics. He is often in the business here of clearing up certain confusions and misunderstandings regarding what he says in Knowledge and its Limits. Since Williamson means to “reverse the trajectory” of recent epistemological thought, it is perhaps to be expected that there will be the tendency to misconstrue his work. Seeing how he clears up certain confusions helps to enhance our understanding of the claims and arguments of Knowledge and its Limits. Similarly, in those cases in which he stands in defense of the arguments of the book, we can learn a great deal from watching him use elements of his work in new ways and from watching him make and utilize some illuminating distinctions in fending off objections. Even when Williamson is concerned primarily to point out the shortcomings of his critics’ proposals — that is, even in some of his counterattacks — he often makes his points in a way that sheds light on the claims and arguments of Knowledge and its Limits. This too helps to enhance our understanding of those claims and arguments.

We gain the most, I think, from those contributions which offer direct criticisms of Williamson’s views and to which Williamson responds by defending his views. So, in his contribution, “Can the Concept of Knowledge be Analysed?,” Quassim Cassam argues that “Williamson’s positive account of the concept of knowledge,” in Knowledge and its Limits, “amounts to a kind of analysis … [which] has some reductive elements” (p. 13). For Williamson, Cassam argues, it turns out that the concept of a factive mental state operator, or FMSO, is “explanatorily more basic than the concept of knowledge” (p. 24), where an FMSO is “the realization in natural language of a factive stative attitude” such as seeing or remembering (p. 13), and where a “concept C is more explanatorily basic than another concept D if and only if C can be explained without using D but D cannot be explained without using C” (p. 23). Cassam concludes that in spite of Williamson’s claim that the concept of knowledge is not reductively analyzable, he has proposed just such an analysis of that concept.

In his response, Williamson distinguishes between a working explanation and a theorizing explanation. One gives a working explanation, he says (p. 286), when one “say[s] enough to enable someone to become linguistically competent for the first time with an expression for some concept.” One gives a theorizing explanation when one “give[s] a theory about the underlying nature of a concept or its role in a wider setting, a theory that may come as a surprise to those who already have the concept” (p. 286). He goes on to argue, as against the claim that he proposes a reductive analysis of the concept of knowledge (to say nothing of his helpful response to the claim that he is proposing a non-reductive analysis), that in the working sense, as well as in the theorizing sense, neither the concept of knowledge nor the concept of an FMSO is explanatorily more basic than the other. He says that the appearance of a reductive analysis of the concept of knowledge is simply an artefact of conflating the notion of a working explanation with the notion of a theorizing one. This distinction is helpful in its own right, and it also plays a valuable role here as the foundation for a new kind of defense against the claim that the concept of knowledge is reductively analyzable.

Consider too Stephen Schiffer’s contribution, “Evidence = Knowledge: Williamson’s Solution to Skepticism,” in which he argues that Williamson’s E=K thesis supports an ineffective response to a certain sort of skeptical argument. Schiffer is concerned with what he calls EPH skeptical arguments, each of which involves “an uncontentious fact E, a run-of-the-mill proposition P, and a skeptical hypothesis H” (p. 183). Such arguments follow this template (see pp. 183-4):

1. I’m not justified in believing P unless I’m justified in believing not H.

2. I’m not justified in believing not H unless something other than E justifies me in believing not H.

3. There is nothing other than E to justify me in believing not H.

4. ∴ I’m not justified in believing P.

5. If I’m not justified in believing P, then I don’t know P.

6. ∴ I don’t know P.

Schiffer suggests that in rejecting this argument, Williamson targets premise 3 and will maintain that there is something that justifies me in believing that, say,

(Cube) there is a red cube before me

in a good case, in which I am not a brain-in-a-vat and in which I see and therefore know that Cube, but that does not justify me in believing that Cube in a bad case, in which I am a brain-in-a-vat “(and therefore I do not know Cube), but otherwise my situation is as much like [the good case] as it’s possible for it to be” (p. 190). Now, Schiffer grants that I know something in the good case that I fail to know in the bad case, namely, that Cube. Thus, given E = K, according to which one’s evidence just is one’s knowledge, Williamson may maintain that I have evidence in the good case that I lack in the bad case. Still, Schiffer argues, it does not follow from this that there is something present in the good case which justifies me in believing that Cube and which is absent from the bad case. Moreover, Schiffer claims that the degree to which I am justified in believing that Cube in the bad case is exactly the degree to which I am justified in believing that Cube in the good case; what justifies me in believing that Cube in the bad case is identical to what justifies me in believing that Cube in the good case. It therefore seems to Schiffer that Williamson may not deny premise 3.

In responding to Schiffer, Williamson identifies two sorts of justified belief. Whether a belief is inferentially justified “concerns what further arguments, if any, the subject might have for the belief” (p. 358). Whether a belief is normatively justified “concerns whether it is somehow OK for the subject to have the belief” (p. 358). With this distinction in hand, Williamson says (p. 359) that in the good case I am “(fully normatively) justified” in believing that Cube because I know that Cube; my knowing that Cube makes it OK, in some sense, for me to believe that Cube. In the bad case, however, I am “not (fully normatively) justified” in believing that Cube precisely because I don’t know that Cube (p. 359). This response depends on the claim that the standard for full normative justification is nothing less than knowledge, and Schiffer might very well object — indeed, he might have been objecting — to a claim of this sort. So, for Williamson’s response to seem persuasive to those with Schiffer’s concerns, it needs to include a defense — or, at any rate, a fuller defense — of this claim.

In deflecting one criticism of the claim, Williamson says that whether or not knowledge is the standard for full normative justification, “one can lack [such justification] without being in a position to know that one lacks it. This,” he goes on to say (p. 360), "is simply the conclusion of the anti-luminosity argument in Knowledge and its Limits applied to the condition that one is not fully justified in believing Cube." Nonetheless, despite this helpful application of anti-luminosity, the claim that knowledge is the standard for full normative justification stands in need of clarification and support. What precisely does it mean to say that something normatively justifies me in believing that Cube? In what sense does my knowing that Cube make it OK for me to believe that Cube? These questions seem especially pressing when we combine a kind of anti-luminosity claim — that I can know that Cube without being aware that I know it — with the plausible supposition, which might well be one of Schiffer’s suppositions, that x normatively justifies me in believing that p only if I am aware of x.

Of course, none of this detracts from the overall significance of the volume, which includes many exchanges that shed light on Williamson’s epistemological views, especially as those views are expressed and defended in Knowledge and its Limits. The exchange between Williamson and Alvin Goldman gives us a better grasp of Williamson’s E = K thesis, while his exchange with Ram Neta promotes a deeper understanding of the claim that knowledge is unanalyzable. The contributions of Elizabeth Fricker and Ernest Sosa, along with Williamson’s responses to them, shed light on the claim that knowledge is a state of mind. And the contributions of Sanford Goldberg and Jonathan Kvanvig, along with Williamson’s responses to them, help us to have a better understanding of the knowledge account of assertion. All in all, the volume is an especially valuable epistemological resource: it ushers us toward a deeper understanding of Williamson’s epistemology. Here in a single volume are interesting new criticisms of Williamson’s views, leveled by some epistemological heavyweights, and novel defenses of those views, defenses in which Williamson often supplements and further develops his earlier contributions. His pioneering work occupies an important place in epistemology, and this volume is a rich and welcome aid to those of us who have an interest in understanding and appreciating Williamson’s work.