Willing, Wanting, Waiting

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Richard Holton, Willing, Wanting, Waiting, Oxford UP, 2009, 203pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199214570.

Reviewed by Carl Ginet, Cornell University



This book is primarily about intention and a special sort of intention called resolution. The writing is clear and engaging. Its observations and analyses strike me as mostly acute and sensible. It makes good use of imaginary examples and empirical work from psychology. Overall it is an illuminating work from which anyone interested in its topic can reap considerable profit without undue struggle.

Its eight chapters are titled “Intention”, “Belief”, “Choice”, “Weakness of Will”, “Temptation”, “Strength of Will”, “Rationality”, and “Freedom”. Let me summarize these briefly (and perforce selectively).

Holton embraces Bratman’s (and I think the now dominant) view that intentions are special mental states, not reducible to desires and/or beliefs, that stable intentions are indispensable in creatures with our cognitive limitations, enabling us to coordinate our activities with our future selves and with each other. He defines a resolution as a specific type of intention that is designed to stand firm in the face of anticipated contrary inclinations when the time for action comes: it’s an intention to F at t accompanied by a second-order intention not to abandon that intention in face of expected temptations at t to do so.

Holton argues that an intention to F does not entail a “flat-out” or full belief that one will F if one tries, but at most a partial belief that one will, i.e., a belief that it is a “live possibility” that one will F that is accompanied by a belief that it is also a live possibility that one will not F. He argues that we need a corresponding notion of a partial intention (of which more below).

Holton defines choices (decisions) as acts of forming intentions that conclude deliberation as to what to do. He points out that such choices are not just routine translations of judgment into action but are often made in the absence of any judgment that the chosen alternative is the best one: either the agent is indifferent between the alternatives considered or thinks them incommensurable or (most often) simply hasn’t time or resources to figure out which is best.

Holton argues that weakness of will is best thought of as failure to stick with one’s resolutions when one should: “unreasonable revision of a contrary inclination defeating intention (a resolution) in response to the presence of those very inclinations” (p. 78). He details advantages of this account over the competing (and widely accepted) view that weakness of will is akrasia, i.e., failure to act in accord with one’s judgment as to what is best. He points out that failure to stick with a resolution often does not involve akrasia, because it is often accompanied at the time of action with a change of judgment as to what would be best to do. Although this is what typically happens in ordinary cases of succumbing to temptation, Holton argues, citing empirical evidence, that it does not typically happen in addictive behavior, which will often display both weakness of will and akrasia.

Holton argues, citing empirical evidence, that the mental effort made in sticking with resolutions, in resisting temptations, uses up the power that it exercises, analogously to the way physically resisting a physical force uses up muscular energy. He is inclined to think that the willpower exercised in resisting temptation may be distinct from the power used in other sorts of mental work (such as deliberating or solving math problems), but acknowledges that more empirical work is needed to show this. (I’m inclined to think more philosophical work is needed to clarify just what the claim means, and what sort of evidence would show the distinction of faculties being claimed.)

Holton discusses the question of when and why it is rational to stick with one’s intentions and disagrees with Bratman on the criteria for this in the case of resolutions (of which more below).

Holton argues that his account of choice and sticking with resolutions contributes to understanding how we have an experience of freedom. He spells out some confused ways in which one might come to think that this experience is illusory if determinism is true, but he explicitly declines to consider philosophical incompatibilists’ ways of reaching that conclusion (of which more below).

Let me now examine three topics in more detail: (1) Holton’s notion of a partial intention, (2) his disagreement with Bratman over the criteria for when it is rational to reconsider resolutions, and (3) his treatment of freedom.


Holton defines partial intention (p. 36) as follows:

An intention to F is partial iff it is designed to achieve a given end E and it is accompanied by one or more alternative intentions also designed to achieve E [and the agent is not criticizably irrational in having these attitudes].

What makes intentions partial is the weakening of the consistency constraints that apply to full intentions: an agent is criticizably irrational for having full intentions that are inconsistent with each other or with his full beliefs. An agent who partially intends to bring about E by A-ing and also partially intends to bring about E by B-ing, while believing that he can’t bring about E in both ways, is perfectly rational, which he would not be if he fully intended those things.

Holton thinks we need partial intentions in order to describe certain sorts of cases adequately. I’m not convinced. It seems to me that descriptions in terms of full intentions will capture what is going on in his examples, provided we get the intentions’ contents right. He gives three examples.

a) An agent’s plan is to try first to get a fallen tree off the driveway by levering it with a crowbar, then, if that fails, by cutting it up with a chainsaw, then, if that fails, by dragging it with a car, and finally, if that fails, by calling an expensive tree removal service. Holton’s description: the agent partially intends to get the tree off by levering it, partially intends to get it off by cutting it up, partially intends to get it off by dragging it with the car, and partially intends to get the tree removal service to do it, but he does not of course fully intend all of these things. I see nothing wrong with the following alternative description (mentioned by Holton): the content of the agent’s full intention is a conjunction: first try levering it as a way of moving it; if that doesn’t work, try starting the chain saw; if neither levering nor chainsaw works, try maneuvering the car into position to drag the tree; if none of the aforementioned attempts works, get the tree removal service. The specification of acts in the conjuncts need not be in terms of mere trying. The first can be just: move it by levering it; similarly with the consequents of the conditionals in the other conjuncts. Compatibility of all the conjuncts is preserved, since if an earlier attempt succeeds, the remaining conditional intention-contents will all be true in virtue of having false antecedents. And the whole conjunction can be compatible with what the agent fully believes.

b) An agent intends to return some books to the library on his way home but also takes his laptop so he can renew online at home in case he forgets. Holton’s description: he partially intends to return the books and he partially intends to renew them online, but does not fully intend either of these things. A plausible alternative account in terms of a full intention: the content of the agent’s plan is a conjunction: if I remember at the right time on the way home, to return the books to the library; and if I don’t remember to return them on the way home, to renew them online after I get home.

c) There is the sort of example where an agent simultaneously tries to achieve a certain end in two different ways, only one of which, he knows, can work. One instance of this is Bratman’s example of firing two different guns at a video-game target, intending to hit it one way or the other. Another instance I like is the example of an agent’s intending to open double doors by simultaneously pushing on one side and pulling on the other, knowing that they open only one way but not knowing which. Holton’s partial-intention description would be: he partially intends to open the door by pulling one side with his right hand and partially intends to open it by pushing the other side with his left hand. A plausible alternative account in terms of a full intention: the agent intends to pull with his right hand and push with his left hand and by one of these actions to open the door.

Holton’s reasons for thinking that such alternative descriptions in terms of full intentions won’t work are unpersuasive. Concerning the tree-moving example, he seems to concede that each intention concerning one of the planned attempts after the first can be plausibly treated as a full intention that is conditional on the failure of earlier attempts, but points out that the intention about the first attempt cannot be treated as conditional. True, but it can be treated as a full unconditional intention, without sacrificing consistency of its content with the other (conditional) intention-contents or the contents of the agent’s full beliefs about the situation.

Concerning the library books example, he denies that the intention to return the books can be seen as conditional, apparently taking this to be in need of no argument. But it seems obvious to me that the agent’s intentions are conditional: to return the books on the way home if he doesn’t forget and to renew them online if he does forget. That these conditionals are part of his plan is clear from the fact that he takes steps in advance to deal with the situation in case he does forget.

Concerning the simultaneous actions aimed at the same end, he points out that the intention concerning each action cannot be conditional on the failure of the attempt by the other action, since the attempts are simultaneous. True, but my suggestion shows another way to specify the content of a full intention here — by conjoining a conjunction with a disjunction: to act simultaneously in both ways and thereby to obtain the end in one way or the other.


For ordinary intentions that are not resolutions Holton agrees with Bratman that our judgment whether an agent was rational in reconsidering/not reconsidering a resolution at the time of action should be determined by whether nonreflective tendencies or habits regarding reconsideration/nonreconsideration that it is generally (in the long run) reasonable for the agent to have would on balance yield reconsideration/nonreconsideration. However, Holton but not Bratman thinks the same holds for resolutions even in cases where the agent acquires no new relevant information between the time of making the resolution and the time for action. A general habit of not reconsidering unless one acquires new pertinent information seems reasonable and supports carrying through with a resolution to F (which is precisely an intention not to reconsider the intention to F in face of anticipated temptation and judgment shift about what it would be best to do). This explains why it is rational not to reconsider one’s resolution in ordinary no-new-information cases.

But Bratman thinks that in extraordinary no-new-information cases like Kavka’s toxin example (where one is offered a huge reward if one will on Monday merely form the intention to drink a toxin on Wednesday while knowing that the reward will be paid on Tuesday if one succeeds in forming the intention), appealing to the reasonableness of a general habit of not reconsidering in the absence of new information gives the wrong result; for there, he thinks, it would be on Wednesday irrational not to reconsider and revise. If that is accepted, the question for Holton becomes whether the rationality of reconsidering and revising the toxin resolution can be supported by appealing to other tendencies or habits it would be reasonable for the agent to have. Bratman thinks not. Holton’s view on the matter seems mixed.

He takes it to be clear that if the agent were to reconsider, his preferences at the time of reconsideration would dictate that he should revise. But whether he should reconsider is, he thinks, a harder question. One tendency with respect to reconsidering resolutions that it is reasonable to have is to reconsider when the reasons for adopting the resolution no longer obtain; to go along with this tendency in the toxin case would be on Wednesday to reconsider since one already has the money to obtain which was one’s reason for forming the resolution. However, another tendency it is reasonable to have with respect to resolutions is not to reconsider in the face of a temptation to do so that was anticipated when the resolution was formed, and in the toxin case it was anticipated at the time of resolution that one would at the time of action no longer have the reason for acting that one had at the time of resolution.

So is the upshot that it’s just indeterminate whether it is rational of the agent to reconsider his resolution in the toxin case? I’m unsure that is Holton’s verdict. Some of his remarks (p. 104) suggest that, since toxin style cases are so peculiar and so unlikely to occur often if at all, it would not be reasonable to want to have a general tendency to nonreconsideration in such cases. So there is no reasonable-general-tendency consideration supporting the rationality of nonreconsideration, only the one supporting the rationality of reconsideration, and Holton can agree with Bratman that the agent in a toxin case should reconsider at the time of action.

Even if, owing to the one-offness of the circumstances in toxin style cases, we cannot argue on the basis of its long run benefits that a tendency to nonreconsideration in such circumstances is a reasonable thing to have, it seems as though one who is at the point of resolution in a toxin style case should hope he has such a tendency. As Holton says, if we know that we do not have the disposition not to reconsider toxin-style resolutions, “it seems likely that we will not be able to form the resolution to drink the toxin at all, let alone do so rationally” (p. 104).

This raises the question whether it can ever be rational to form a toxin-style resolution. Bratman argues that it cannot, on the basis of his “linking principle”, which, as Holton rephrases it, goes as follows:

I should not form an intention that I now believe I should, at the time of action, rationally revise.

Holton argues convincingly that on one natural interpretation — where the content of my belief is spelled out as being that if I were to reconsider I should rationally revise — this principle is an implausibly strong constraint on practical rationality (pp. 150-2). There are pretty clear counterexamples, and it makes it irrational to form even an ordinary resolution to resist anticipated temptation and change of judgment if one were to reconsider.

Instead, he says, we should subscribe to a weaker interpretation of the principle:

I should not form an intention that I now believe I should at the time of action, rationally reconsider and revise [emphasis mine].

Holton does not spell out how this weaker principle allows us to say that it is rational to form an ordinary resolution to resist anticipated temptation and potential change of judgment, but does not allow us to say that it is irrational to form a toxin resolution.

I think an explanation of this might be given in terms of a difference that (so far as I can find) he himself does not remark. In the case of an ordinary resolution, the agent’s judgment at the time of resolution is that the change in judgment he might well make were he to reconsider at the time of action, would, in light of his current values and beliefs as to the future facts, be a shift to error. Hence it is rational for him in such circumstances to hope that his nonreflective tendencies will ensure at the time of action that he will not reconsider. The same, however, cannot be said for the toxin resolution. In that case, the agent’s judgment at the time of resolution is that the change of judgment he is likely to make at the time of action if he then reconsiders will be, in light of his current values and beliefs as to the future facts will, not a shift to error but just what is called for. And so it will not be rational for him to hope at the time of resolution that his nonreflective tendencies will ensure at the time of action that he will not reconsider. This seems to be the crucial difference that makes it rational, despite anticipated judgment shift, to form an ordinary resolution but not to form a toxin resolution.


Holton’s final chapter is concerned to understand the experience of freedom. We surely have such an experience and, says Holton, Samuel Johnson was “surely right to insist that we would need very good grounds before rejecting it as illusory.” The chapter does not discuss the grounds for thinking it illusory that have been proposed by incompatibilist philosophers in the last several decades. (The only incompatibilist work listed in his bibliography is Kane’s The Significance of Free Will.) But the chapter does manage to convey the idea that we lack those “very good grounds”.

For instance, he describes the view that determinism entails that one is never free with respect to whether one decides to F as “an instance of radical skepticism” (p. 177) and likens it to radical skepticism about knowledge, implying that it is a view that no sensible person can seriously hold. Further, he dismisses the question “whether there can be free will, and moral responsibility, if everything — including what we choose, and whether we stick to our resolutions — is understood as being determined” as badly formed and resting on the false assumption “that we have a clear and determinate notion of free will, clear and determinate enough that we can ask whether it is compatible with determinism.” It is disappointing to see these insinuations that incompatibilism can be dismissed and no argument to back them up.

To bring out what the experience of freedom is we need, says Holton, “to identify ways in which action is experienced as something agents instigate, rather than something that just happens to them as they look passively on” (p. 168). An incompatibilist who thinks that a free choice must be an uncaused event will want a characterization that explains how, as Holton puts it, “that experience could be somehow mistaken for the experience of being an uncaused cause.”

He points out that the experience of choosing differently on distinct occasions when one has the same conscious beliefs, desires and intentions gives evidence that decision is not (or not always) determined by such antecedents. According to Holton, in providing evidence of that, the experience of choice provides evidence to its subjects that “they could have acted differently given their prior beliefs, desires and intentions.” If this refers to a particular choice (a natural understanding), the incompatibilist will see it as making an unwarranted inference, precisely because, as Holton goes on to say, the experience described provides no evidence that “their choices were not determined by anything” and, on the incompatibilist view, if some other sorts of antecedents determined their choice then at the point of making the choice they could not have chosen otherwise. And for an incompatibilist, it is the ease with which one’s experience that one’s choice is not determined by one’s prior beliefs, desires, and intentions can be mistaken for an experience that it is not determined by anything that explains how the experience, or, better, the experience-caused impression, of freedom could be illusory. It’s analogous to how the experience of seeing nothing there that moves the balloon in the air gives rise to the impression that there is nothing there that moves it.

Holton’s own account of how the experience of freedom — the experience that antecedent beliefs desires and intentions determine neither what choices we make nor how much effort of will we make to resist temptations — can seem to conflict with determinism (the belief that something antecedent always causally determines what our choices or exercises of willpower will be) is rather different. It is an explanation of how determinism could be confused with what Holton calls “global fatalism”, which says that “if an outcome is determined to obtain, nothing can have causal impact on it.” This is a rather serious confusion, as Holton points out, and it may, for all I know, be true that people are sometimes led to the view that determinism is incompatible with freedom through this confusion. I myself don’t see how it would be easy to get into this confusion, but this may be because my thinking about that incompatibility has for so long been governed by a quite different (and, as far as I can see, unconfused) argument.