Wisdom Won from Illness: Essays in Philosophy and Psychoanalysis

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Jonathan Lear, Wisdom Won from Illness: Essays in Philosophy and Psychoanalysis, Harvard University Press, 2017, 328pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674967847.

Reviewed by Brian O'Connor, University College Dublin


Jonathan Lear writes about a diverse range of topics with a steady mix of persuasion and provocation. The book, made up of previously published papers, includes chapters on issues in psychoanalysis, the interpretation of Plato, contemporary literature (J. M. Coetzee, Marilynne Robinson), and one on As You Like It. Among the psychoanalytic parts is a consideration of the significance of Aristotelian moral psychology in framing the objectives of the therapeutic process. (Lear defends himself from the charge of anachronism with brio.) There is also an ingenious reading of Freud's maddening Rat Man case. Lear occasionally illustrates his theoretical claims through notes from his own clinical practice. To the psychoanalytic outsider those short vignettes offer a tantalizing glimpse of the analytic hour. And with regards to questions of philosophy readers will find their time well spent in looking at Lear's thoughts on rationality and practical truth. I will try to give some sense of the specifically philosophical character of the book by narrowing the focus of this review to the details of just a couple of its themes.

A number of the chapters return us to the topic Lear chose for his Tanner Lecturers, that of irony. In 'What is a Crisis of Intelligibility?' Lear makes the compelling suggestion, following his account of the destruction of the Crow way of life, that we understand the existential loss of intelligibility as a situation in which 'the agents themselves cannot see how to take up the concepts of their past and project them into their futures' (57). The agents, he goes on to claim, ask themselves the 'anxious' and longing question of what it now means to be a Crow (65). They are thrown into this question by a 'moment of ironic experience' (67), and the question itself causes further dislocation. Lear finds this same experience among those medical practitioners who report no longer knowing how to be a doctor in the context of a profession suffocated by bureaucracy and the fear of litigation. At first sight the sense of disruption described here might not look much like irony. However, that perception, Lear argues, arises from the failure to grasp the concept of irony as a practical one. Those with that specific experience appear to observers to lack 'earnestness' (71), or to be feigning an ignorance which is little more than a conceptually generated question about what their well-defined roles now mean. A practical understanding of irony -- the genuine thing -- is, though, experiential. It arises in the context of the effort to live intelligibly. In this way irony may become 'an occasion to break out of illusion' (72), the illusion that what is said to constitute our roles or social identities exhausts everything we need from those roles or identities. With these thoughts Lear, it seems to me, enriches our ongoing understanding of the very idea of irony.

Now one might think that the ironic disruption Lear describes would lead to two possible effects on those who want to act. It could induce paralysis as one became ever more doubtful about what it means to be what one wants to be. Indeed this effect seems to be implied in Lear's notion of 'vertigo' (67). The other option would be to follow the recommendation of German romanticism and simply commit to action with no final claim to knowledge or truth. But Lear has a different map of the situation. An 'ironic existence', he maintains, does not involve 'ironic experiences all the time' (74). One may, in fact, 'live well all the time', through such an existence, 'with the possibility of ironic experience' (74-5). The disruption we might have thought to be a feature of ironic experience, it turns out, is not perhaps so unsettling after all. Indeed, it may be one way towards an agreeable reconciliation with the world around us. Ironic existence, Lear holds, 'does not require alienation from established social practice' (75). I think Lear is moved to that thought by the case of his ironic doctors, who freeing themselves from administrative vices, find a new and perhaps more authentic form of medical practice. (The lot of the Crow would seem to be a different one.) The doctors might exemplify that openness to ironic experience which, Lear writes, 'is compatible with passionate engagement in social life' (75). However, the compatibility claim is made through an episode from the life of Socrates. Prior to battle our hero was observed standing for hours on end in a state of perfect immobility. The cause was an ironically disrupting philosophical experience. But Socrates did not sit out the battle. When his moment arrived he threw himself into the melee, 'behaving with outstanding courage as socially understood' (78). It seems, though, that no relationship or continuity exists between the two events: the figurative paralysis of Socrates' ironic moment has no explained bearing on his subsequent feat of arms.

The abandonment of irony might then be required, under Lear's model, if action is to follow. It is not easy to see what Socrates has gained from his prior irony once faced with his martial responsibilities. And if there is nothing we can point to, what purpose does the episode serve other than to say that ironic moments are one thing, regular life another? A more cohesive way of thinking about the compatibility issue is found in the chapter, 'The Ironic Creativity of Socratic Doubt'. Lear once again draws on Kierkegaard's view that Socrates 'doubted that one is a human being by birth' (105, quoting Kierkegaard). Significantly this ironic doubt itself turns out to have the potential to be 'creative and life-enhancing' (104). This sense of irony is not associated with a loss of intelligibility in any clear way. Ironic doubt -- in this second sense -- unsettles 'the concept human', a process of 'opening up' through which we become human (118). In this line of thought the subsequent action is marked by ironic experience. Regular life may be made through the creative process of ironic doubt.

The book contains two essays on the psychological dimensions of Plato's use of stories as persuasive devices. I will comment solely on the especially remarkable 'Allegory and Myth in Plato's Republic'. At the centre of this chapter is the infamous 'Noble Falsehood' (Lear's preferred translation). Lear sets out the considerations that Plato puts in place that give this myth a powerful and uniquely philosophical function. He starts with the thought that the effectiveness of philosophical argument will always be curtailed by an 'outlook' acquired prior to debate. Allegories may be effective in equipping us with the better outlook for that time when proper philosophical thinking is required. Lear then offers a magnificent account of how children relate to allegories. Of particular relevance to Lear's account is the child's lack of capacity 'to recognize allegory as such' which means that 'he cannot grasp the deeper meaning of the story that is entering his soul, and thus he cannot subject it to critical scrutiny' (208). Since a 'concept of truth' is unavailable to children, it is not quite right to think, Lear points out, that they take in allegories as though they were true (209). Eventually that concept is acquired, but what was learned prior to the development of the capacity for truth 'casts a shadow over an entire life' (210). This is evident in the case of Cephalus who still holds childlike views of the advantages his wealth will offer him in the afterlife. But other myths may be more philosophically serviceable, not so much in what they want us to believe but in how they predispose us to think (that is, eventually, metaphysically).

Before turning to Lear's specific proposal I think it is useful to consider an open issue in Plato's text (one that occurred to me in response to Lear's own exposition of the matter). That is the issue of whether Plato thinks that the Noble Falsehood should be offered to adults in precisely the same form as it is to be taught to children. This issue arises because Socrates tells Glaucon that 'I have to try and persuade first of all the rulers themselves and the soldiers, and then the rest of the city, that the entire upbringing and education we gave them, their whole experience of it happening to them, was after all merely a dream, something they imagined . . .' (414d, Griffith translation). And Socrates then appears to agree with and take encouragement from Glaucon's observation that those at whom this story is directed -- adults -- would never believe it, but 'their children might, and their children after them, and the rest of the population in later generations' (415d). Could it make sense to tell children who have not yet been educated that their 'entire upbringing and education' has been a dream? Perhaps it would be more obvious to exclude the ontological modifier, so to speak, and go straight to the origins myth itself (and thereby inculcate in children civic loyalty, social solidarity, together with Plato's unique notion of ideal familial attachments). Lear's interpretation, however, hinges on the inclusion of that modifier. He seems to have in mind influencing children with an allegory which tells them that life is but a dream. This allegory will pursue them until a vital moment in which, as adults, they have an 'aha!-experience' (216) for which the dream allegory prepared them. They would, in those moments, 'be open to the reality of the forms' and their distinction from appearance (216), or at least the various gradations of appearance recounted in the story of the Cave.

Lear's emphasis on the dream element has the consequence, which many may find intolerable, of diluting the 'surface' significance of the content of the myth of metals and thereby rescuing the Noble Falsehood from the 'superficial' (217) thought that it is merely ideological. He suggests that 'while the Noble Falsehood may be politically conservative, it is epistemically revolutionary. It is meant to instill discontent with one's entire current epistemic condition' (215). The legitimacy of the appearance-based epistemic status quo can be toppled through this implanted disposition. We might think, against Lear, that Plato's proposal to redraw every standing relationship within the state is anything but conservative. But his inventive interpretative moves, to bring out an epistemic radicalism in the allegory of the Noble Falsehood, nevertheless add up to an absorbing and quite startling piece of philosophy.

Lear writes of the psychoanalyst Hans Loewald that he is one of those thinkers who may have 'many remarkable psychological insights' but 'when you try to count their thoughts you never really get past number one' (178). I do not think the same is true of Lear himself. Certainly the notion of disruption followed by reconciliation -- integration or reintegration -- exerts a strong presence across many of the fifteen essays. And it is notable that Lear is not inclined to accept that we must take from Freud the pessimistic message that 'it is inevitable that civilization frustrates human happiness' (48), an account which leaves us with no realistic prospect of deep reconciliation or integration. That characterization of Lear's thinking can only go so far, though. This excellent volume is filled with finely developed and irreducibly particular insights that deserve to be read on their own terms.