Without Criteria: Kant, Whitehead, Deleuze, and Aesthetics

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Steven Shaviro, Without Criteria: Kant, Whitehead, Deleuze, and Aesthetics, MIT Press, 2009, 170pp., $28.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262195768.

Reviewed by Gregg Lambert, Syracuse University



I often enjoy those books of philosophy that begin like good science fiction. In this vein, Steven Shaviro’s Without Criteria begins: “I imagine a world in which Whitehead takes the place of Heidegger.” In other words, he poses the question, “What if Whitehead, instead of Heidegger, had set the agenda for postmodern thought?” (ix). Starting from this “philosophical fantasy”, Shaviro sets out to describe a possible world without Heidegger, which I take to be a sort of Leibnizian wager that is bound up with the “turn to Whitehead” today. Accordingly, “a world in which Whitehead takes the place of Heidegger” must be understood as a divergence from the image of thought that belongs to a tradition of post-Kantian critical philosophy, the recurrent features of which have been an obsessive concern over the limits of representation and the critique of subjectivity, and by an allergic reaction to modern science and technology. The main objective of this tradition has been the exposure of the limits of all representational systems by a regressive procedure of critical reason that leads them into a state of crisis as an anticipatory step to their radical reconstruction; the second objective is the laying bare of all naïve and subjectivist constructions of identity, which leads to the production of difference introduced from the critical perspective of “otherness” (as in the case, most recently, in the critical perspectives surrounding the animal and the post-human).

The shortcomings of this tradition of post-Kantian philosophy have been found in the fact that the anticipated radical phase of “construction” has never become a positive event as such, and the actual discovery of new possibilities for subjectivity have been through a glass darkly. The philosophies of this tradition have never fully been able to depart from a negative or deconstructive phase; as a result, the future is posited as a static and essentially “empty form of time”, often accompanied by a highly speculative image of the event itself as the undetermined and the ungrounded, hence “radical”, commencement of an entirely new ontological order. In short, we have merely replaced one metaphysics with another, namely, with a metaphysics of difference; moreover, we have supplanted the universal pretentions of the Kantian Subject with a progressive number of new radical subjectivisms. What, after all, is the recent turn to the animal (or to the nakedness of zoe itself) if not yet another in a series of attempts to “de-center the metaphysics of the Western [human] subject” that is already pre-programmed by this tradition of critique (epoké)?

But let us stop here! In positing “a world without Heidegger”, retracing our steps backward to a point of deviation where Whitehead takes his place, inevitably we must begin somewhere. According to Shaviro, we must start from Kant, whose transcendental philosophy takes up the first half of Without Criteria; more specifically the “Transcendental Dialectic” of the second section of the First Critique and “the Analytic of the Beautiful” of the Third Critique, which are then drawn into comparison with Whitehead’s system. Beginning all over again from Kant seems like one possible solution to the impasse brought about by the previous tradition of post-Kantian critical philosophy, and it is here that Shaviro’s own intentions are most clear, since we are presented with the image of philosophy at the crossroads, so to speak. Following Kant’s transcendental reduction, we are given two possible routes for a philosophy of the future to take: one leads via Heidegger straight to “Derrida and his epigones” (which Shaviro implies is a dead-end for philosophy in this century); the other, offered in Without Criteria, leads to Deleuze via Whitehead, even though this route remains “virtual”, that is to say, still under construction (by Shaviro and other Deleuzians, including Isabelle Stengers and Brian Massumi, who might also add James and Pierce along the way). Thus, it is not by chance that Without Criteria is the second volume of the MIT series edited by Massumi and Erin Manning, Technologies of Lived Abstraction, which proposes to publish works not content to rest with the habitual divisions (between “aesthetics” and “politics”, for example, central to Shaviro’s notion of “critical aestheticism”) and “to catch new thought and action dawning at a creative crossroad”. This could even be said to signal a “Whiteheadian revolution” that is taking place in some quarters of the Deleuzian camp, if not in the general field of continental philosophy today.

In the “turn to Whitehead” proposed by Without Criteria the most telling sign of the detour toward a new tradition of post-Kantian philosophy is bound up with the emphasis on “pure feeling” (without cognition) and, moreover, on the beautiful rather than on sublime feelings. As we know, much of the previous tradition has also been obsessed with those passages in The Critique of Judgment that pertain to the sublime, and to the “dynamic sublime” in particular, which presents to the imagination the image of an overpowering nature that causes it to falter, and which Kant famously determines as a negative presentation of the nature of Reason itself. This topic has become a staple of post-Kantian critical philosophy, which supposedly shows Kant’s failure to follow the contours of the intuition occasioned by his own thought, which Deleuze himself defined as “a free and indeterminate accord between the faculties” that would not be the speculative accord of reason, since it would correspond to an object of “real and not merely possible experience”. Nevertheless, we might find a similar moment in Whitehead’s Concept of Nature, as Isabelle Stengers points out in a conversation between the philosopher and Lucien Price, where Whitehead exclaims:

We are here, with our finite realities and our physical sensations, in the presence of a universe whose possibilities are infinite, and even though we cannot apprehend them, these infinite possibilities exist effectively.1

As Deleuze once said regarding Leibniz, every philosopher has a cry that immediately leads to a fundamental position, such as “the real is rational”, and this can be understood as Whitehead’s cry: “the universe and its infinite possibilities effectively exist” (i.e., these infinite possibilities are real even if they are not necessarily actual). Here, one can also see the relationship to Deleuze, even though the latter derives a similar statement from Proust and not from Whitehead. However, what distinguishes Whitehead from previous calls for “the return to experience itself” is that he does not choose to focus on the finitude of the human faculties or the limitations of language to explore the “effective existence” of real qualities belonging to the universe, which is to say, he does not spend his time negatively pointing out these limitations (of language, perception, judgment, etc.). We are not trapped in “the prison-house of Language”, or in the words of Stengers, “we are not prisoners of a closed circuit between perception and denomination”.2 Instead, he simply admits that there is an inevitable loss in the process of transition from experience to thought, but this is the price of communication. For example,

the transition of the ‘red’ of experience to the ‘red’ of thought is accompanied by an unfathomable loss of content … This loss in the transition to thought is compensated for by the fact that thought is communicable in a manner that sensible experience is not.3

It is here we find the aesthetic problem that is posed by the beautiful as a sensible feeling that cannot be communicated in itself, but only in the form of a nomination of the beautiful. For Whitehead, however, reason does not begin with naming: “nomination does not function as a point of departure for reasoning, but rather as a point of accumulation [a terminus] around which other nominations could eventually be added as well.”4 Simply put, the word (the nomination) is not the condition of possible experience of the object, but rather its terminus, its end. Moreover, in Whitehead’s philosophy the culmination of experience is called “satisfaction”, which opens to an aesthetic point-of-view. Nomination, which makes cognition possible, is but one form of satisfaction. There are others. As Shaviro argues, “there are other ways, besides the linguistic one, of prehending the world, or more precisely entities in the world” (159). Understanding is not privileged in the transition from sensibility to thought, as in Kant, but neither is consciousness, as in the phenomenology of Husserl, since there are satisfactions that take place below or outside the realm of “consciousness of”, that is, outside the precincts of human intentionality and its various “cultural worlds”, and even outside the transcendental subject and its possible “life-worlds” (i.e., histories). Not only are unconscious modes of thinking and satisfaction accommodated by Whitehead’s system, but there are also other subjective forms of satisfaction (experience) that do not have any relation to human consciousness, broadly defined, such as the satisfaction expressed by living cells, crystals, clouds and trees. Freed from the Kantian straightjacket of the transcendental subject who gives to itself the laws for regulating the objects of understanding, we are now ready to explore the world inhabited by both organic and inorganic societies.

At this point, let us attempt to think of this difference with regard to the experience of the sublime. In encountering the overpowering nature of a terrible being that causes my imagination to falter (i.e., its incapacity to synthesize in a sensuous representation an object of understanding), Whitehead does not feel the need to posit the reality of this Nature “beyond the turn of experience” and, thus, to accord it the special status of a human reason that confronts its own limits and thereby transcends them by turning back on its own conditions. According to Kant, “in presenting the sublime in nature the mind feels agitated, while in an aesthetic judgment about the beautiful in nature it [the mind] is in restful contemplation” (quoted in Shaviro, 152). This runs contrary, however, to the feeling of satisfaction given by Whitehead to the highest subjective form of the universe (God) who he describes as a “pure craving for intensity” or as a “striving for novelty”. Consequently, the form of satisfaction ascribed to God is not “passive contemplation without knowledge” (as in Leibniz), “spiritual contentment of eternal necessity” (as in Spinoza), “achievement of absolute knowledge” (as in Hegel), nor even “restful and peaceful contemplation” (as in Kant) — they are striving for creative novelty and more intensity. Thus, as Shaviro implies, Whitehead’s metaphysics retains the philosophical portrait of God as a fictional persona of the great artist, but Whitehead’s artist is only enjoying while he is creating and once he comes to the end destroys his work in a fresh creative process — in an “insistent craving” for novelty and adventure (161).

Turning now to the conclusion of Shaviro’s study, I must confess my feeling that there is always something funny about the creation of new metaphysical systems. As was also the case with Kant, this often occurs when philosophers must finally come down to earth and apply their systems to current moral and political realities. (This results in the most bizarre of discussions like whether suicide is allowable under the terms of the categorical imperative.) In this case, Shaviro proposes a kind of practical reason on the basis of Whitehead’s notion of creativity that could be applied to issues of global piracy and copyright infringement. If the only “real effective reality” is the process of creation, the actual occasions of novelty and intensity, then everything must be constantly destroyed, ripped off, and recreated anew. As Shavirio writes,

Whitehead’s aesthetics, with its intensive focus on this how [something radically new can emerge out of the prehension of already existing elements], takes on a special urgency in a culture, such as ours, that is poised on a razor’s edge between the corporate ownership, the interminable recycling, of “intellectual property,” on the one hand, and the pirating, reworking, and transformation of such alleged “property,” often in the violation of copyright laws, on the other (159).

Consequently, if we began with the science fiction phantasy where “Whitehead takes the place of Heidegger in setting the postmodern agenda”, we end with a phantasy of globalization as a bric-a-brac field of singularities insistently craving for novelty and adventure, “ripping” the works of other living societies through a creative process that approximates what Whitehead himself called “robbery”. Consequently, the possible world that Shaviro imagines on the basis of Whitehead’s metaphysical system comes off looking a lot like China in the cultural field of global capitalism today.

It is at this point, however, that Shaviro implicitly worries about the “consequences” of his championing of Whitehead’s aestheticism by invoking the Marxian critique of Fredric Jameson concerning the cultural logic of late capitalism. If Whitehead managed to set the postmodern agenda, would his system be immune to Jameson’s earlier criticisms that were first applied to Deleuze and Guattari? The question would be whether Whitehead’s metaphysical system and his aestheticism, whereby “beauty takes the place of truth”, might be explained by the fact that it is the most approximate “subjective form” of global capitalism today. Shaviro himself cannot adequately answer this question in the closing pages of Without Criteria, but only hopes “that Whitehead’s aestheticism is radical enough that it nudges and cajoles us away from the complacencies and satisfactions of commodity culture” (159). Yet on the basis of Shaviro’s own exposition, there would be no criteria in Whitehead’s own system for preferring one form of satisfaction (experience) over another, which is to say, no basis for a critique of judgment in the construction of the aesthetic concepts of experience and taste. Therefore, the question of “consequences” can also be applied to Shaviro’s own decision to “bracket” the entire history of critical philosophy and, like Whitehead, “to remain cheerfully indifferent” to more critical alternatives, including the alternative possibility offered by a Marxian perspective. One question occurs to us then: in a metaphysical system in which creativity becomes the “ultimate notion of the highest generality” for every actual occasion of real experience, and in which the criteria of beauty replaces truth in the act of contemplating the world (a contemplation of creation without judgment, that is, or certainly without ‘the judgment of God’), what would be the subjective aim of every organism if not a kind of robbery of all other living societies for its food?

In the above, I have employed the moral term “robbery”, not from Marx, but from a statement that appears in the third chapter of Process and Reality concerning the second principle characteristic of the psychological-physiology of life in Whitehead’s cosmological argument: “Life is robbery”. The first characteristic of life is the reaction adapted to the capture of intensity in a variety of occasions; the second characteristic is the definition of the capture of intensity as “robbery”. According to Whitehead, the fundamental law of nature is robbery, which is then reactively adapted by living societies into the form of a hierarchy; thus, the principle of robbery is distributed as the governing relation between different living societies through which the totality of Nature is ordered. “Thus,” Whitehead states, “all [societies] require interplay with their environment; and in the case of living societies this inter-play takes the form of robbery.”5 But it is also at this point, as Whitehead states, “that with life morals become acute. The robber requires justification.”6 Consequently, it is one thing to claim, with Shaviro, that from the purely aesthetic perspective destruction (or robbery) is justified by the degree of novelty that is released into the world, but it is quite another thing to pose this justification from the perspective of another living society that has just been robbed to become “food” for the creation of the new beautiful order. According to Whitehead himself, this is where the nature of reflective judgment becomes ethical and concerns the moral issue of creativity that must be “reactively adapted” to fit each living occasion of novelty. Even though creativity becomes “the highest notion of the ultimate generality” in Whitehead’s metaphysical system, it cannot serve as a kind of categorical justification for every actual occasion of “craving for intensity”, for novelty and adventure, in short, for every act of robbery. It is clear that there is a moral dimension to Whitehead’s system as well, a second critique that is hidden behind the first and primary affirmation of the general notion of creativity, and I would even suggest that certain negative and critical feelings (or what Whitehead calls “negative prehensions”) can also belong to the creative process in the production of new “discordant feelings.” Of course, these negative prehensions need not necessarily lead to new prohibitions against beautiful feelings as in most traditional Marxian critiques, which would be tantamount to a prohibition against eating, and according to Whitehead, would result in the loss of inter-play between living societies and the environment composed of other societies, both organic and inorganic. However, it could lead to a construction of “critical aestheticism” that would be capable of both “creativity” and “critique”.

1 Conversation between Whitehead and Lucien Price, quoted in Isabelle Stengers, Penser avec Whitehead: Une libre et sauvage création de concepts (Paris: Seuil, 2002), p. 57.

2 Stengers, Penser avec Whitehead, p. 59.

3 Alfred North Whitehead, Concept of Nature (Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1920), p. 71.

4 Stengers, p. 59.

5 Alfred North Whitehead, Process and Reality (New York: The Free Press, 1929), p. 105.

6 Whitehead, ibid. See also Gregg Lambert, “On Whitehead’s Proposition, ‘Life is Robbery’: Prolegomena to Any Future Ethics”, Postmodern Secular Theology: Fragments of a Radical Tradition, ed. Clayton Crockett (London: Routledge, 2001), pp. 92-103.