Without Hierarchy: The Scale Freedom of the Universe

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Mariam Thalos, Without Hierarchy: The Scale Freedom of the Universe, Oxford University Press, 2013, 278pp., $69.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199917648.

Reviewed by Amit Hagar, University of Indiana Bloomington


Ever since Science published Philip W. Anderson's influential article "More is different" (1972), philosophers of science have sought reassurance in their struggles against reductionism in effective field theories. They saw these theories and the renormalization program that has led to them as the physicists' own admission that reductionism has failed. And if reductionism has failed within physics, or so the story went, then the prospects of extending it outside physics fared no better.

In her intriguing monograph, Miriam Thalos expands on this strategy, and offers yet another renormalization-inspired alternative to reductionism. Her idea is that the standard picture of science as a tower of disciplines whose ontologies are all parasitic on, or derivative from, the most fundamental physical one, is wrong, but its alternative, captured succinctly by Anderson's slogan and commonly known as 'emergence', is also wrong. Her suggestion is that Nature has no scale; the ontologies of the different scientific disciplines not only aren't derivative from (or parasitic on) physics, they are also not organized in a hierarchal tower at all. Her message, to paraphrase a famous NYT journalist, is that ontology is flat.

The book is an attempt to promote this idea, to distinguish it from its rival alternatives, and to support it with arguments and with examples from physics. This attempt, however, is not too successful. While the book's prose is fluent and engaging, woven with humor and sometimes almost chatty, its arguments are unconvincing, and the examples given indicate some serious categorical mistakes.

The main problem can be traced to the attempt to enlist some platitudes from physics to support an over-reaching metaphysics. Here is one: in many cases in physics the behavior of bulk matter is insensitive to its micro-constituents. In such cases we often use a coarse grained description that allows us to depict the unfolding dynamics of the physical system with few macroscopic variables. This practice is common to statistical physics, and to many disciplines outside physics that have imported the methods of statistical physics into their own domain (e.g., biology, cognitive science, psychology and economics).

But from the mere contingent fact that we can describe the behavior of gasses with few macroscopic variables (e.g., temperature, pressure, volume) without resorting to the actual collisions between the (roughly) 1023 molecules the gas is believed to be composed of, it doesn't necessarily follow that the gas has an independent ontological status, on a par with its molecules. Take the molecules away, and there will be no gas. Keep the molecules' mean kinetic energy fixed (by, say, heating the vessel they are in) while reducing its volume, and the rate of the molecule's collisions with the vessel's wall -- what we call "pressure" -- will increase. For the same reason, it would be a mistake to argue from the fact that thermodynamic systems approach equilibrium to the metaphysical view Thalos urges us to accept, on which not "all the real action happens at the micro 'level'" (pp. 100-101). Surely that the entropy of the gas "evolves" in some thermodynamical process doesn't mean there exists an additional force in nature, over and above those which act on the molecules, that causes the gas to increase its entropy; the 2nd law of thermodynamics is just a way of describing the collective behavior of the underlying molecules that the gas is made of.

Another example Thalos thinks militates against the idea that all the real 'action' happens at the micro-level is the phenomena of Bose-Einstein condensate and superconductivity: here we have fermions that act like bosons, i.e., ensembles that have completely different, even opposite, characteristics than their components. But here again I fail to see the point. A pure iceberg conducts sound better than the water molecules it is composed of. This doesn't mean that icebergs are ontologically different from water molecules, so that their melting is a process that is independent of the process suffered by the individual water molecules. In a similar vein a mob sometimes acts differently than the individuals it is composed of. Must we then infer that mob psychology works on the mob as an entity? Can't we assume that it really works on each and every individual, exactly as in the case where we increase the pressure of the gas by increasing the rate of collisions of its constituents with the wall of the vessel?

The "action-at-all-levels" thesis is also supposed to follow from the multiple realizability of the statistical methods in describing critical phenomena across domains. The idea, elaborated only towards the end of the book, seems to be: coarse graining and the power laws of critical exponents are applicable across a wide variety of domains, and, more important, they can explain the universality classes of the renormalization group better than any story about the micro-constituents that the reductionist may come up with, since this universality is, as a matter of fact, insensitive to the actual details of such stories. This explanatory superiority, or so Thalos seems to think, is indicative of a scale-free ontology.

But this is all wrong. First, explanatory superiority is rarely indicative of matters ontological, as the latter often depend on taste. Second, and even more important, the wide applicability of the renormalization group method across domains is, in effect, not explanatorily superior to the detailed micro-dynamical stories after all, because the latter are not supposed to replace it. This is not a contest between two types of explanations; they are both legitimate.

Take the second mistake first. What Thalos -- and many philosophers with her -- ask from the reductionists is simply too much, and so the fact the reductionists fail to deliver is of no consequence. Nowhere in science have reductionist stories ever replaced structural, higher level ones, nor should they be required to do so. At most they complement the structural explanations, demonstrating that a dynamical story is possible which is consistent with the higher level structural story. The reductionist program is in the business of supplying nothing more than such consistency proofs, no less and certainly no more, and so the fact that the details of the micro-constituents do not play a decisive role in determining the critical exponents cannot and should not count against such consistency proofs. If these details did play a role, then, by definition, there would be no point in the "higher level explanation," would there?

As for the first mistake, that of trading explanatory success (epistemology) for a definite world view (ontology), the history of science is saturated with examples where a successful theory has been interpreted as supporting many different ontologies. Take non-relativistic quantum theory. The empirical confirmation of the violations of Bell's inequalities, a result Thalos makes use of in many places in her book, does not force us in any way to accept metaphysical claims such as 'wave-particle duality' or 'quantum indefiniteness'. True, local hidden-variables are ruled out, but from here to abandoning one's pet metaphysics there is still a long way to go. In a similar vein, the success of effective field theories is not indicative of either reductionism or emergence, and at least so far, quantum field theories are consistent with completely opposite ontologies, such as the field or the particle pictures, and the continuum or the discrete, as the fundamental underlying reality.

The book has other infelicities. For example, 'causation' is attacked as inappropriate term in the language of science, only to be replaced with vague notions such as 'action' or 'glue'; yet these terms are never rigorously defined. 'Locality' is also cited as problematic, the reason being, again, the violations of Bell's inequalities, but the fact that quantum theory involves only local interactions is not mentioned. Instead, the reader is led to believe that quantum nonlocality is indicative of the one-scale universe ("How could it be that the universe knows," asks Thalos, "at a local level, how to pass along the right probability information so that, in the end, angular momentum is conserved, with probability 1?" (63). Her answer is that "What's remote at one scale is local at another and so can act there even against lower-scale prohibitions (if such exists) against its acting there" (66). Yet this ontological move -- interesting as it may be -- does not in any way follow from quantum nonlocality, especially when the latter does not mean nonlocal interactions (these are always local in orthodox quantum theory) and simply indicates an underlying non-Boolean probability space, different from the standard classical Boolean one.

Finally, I (and, I believe, many physicists) can tolerate discussions on metaphysics in the philosophy of science if they are somehow conducive to the scientific practice. There are plenty of examples of this connection between metaphysics and practice in the history of science: a finitist metaphysics was conducive to the attempts to introduce fundamental length into field theories in the 1930s, and an adherence to determinism led to the removal of action at a distance and other singularities. But while Thalos spends much time on presenting and defending her metaphysical views, there are only few places in the book -- notably the fifteen pages of chapter 5 -- where a connection between this view and the actual practice of science is elaborated on. Personally I would have liked to see more of this elaboration, since without it one is usually left questioning the whole point of the exercise and its relevance.

A question I believe I can answer is one Thalos asks early in the book (p. 25): what explains the putative independence of biological or psychological phenomena from the phenomena of physics? The answer I can give is quite simple: while collective behavior can often be described with few high level variables which obey some functional rules, and while these rules are insensitive to the "stuff" the micro-constituents are made of, this has nothing to do with ontology, scale-free or otherwise, and has everything to do with the choice of resolution. One could still argue that biological or psychological phenomena are in fact dependent on the phenomena of physics, that they appear not to be so dependent only in practice from a specific low resolution, and that from a higher resolution -- currently beyond our reach -- their dependence would one day become evident. A scale-free universe may be an interesting ontology, but it isn't any more compelling than it was before the success of the renormalization program, or after the reading of Thalos' book.