Without Justification

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Jonathan Sutton, Without Justification, MIT Press, 2007, 180pp., $26.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262693479.

Reviewed by Earl Conee, University of Rochester



The main thesis of this work is that epistemically justified belief is knowledge (JK).  JK has the striking implication that no justified belief is false, as the author Jonathan Sutton well knows.  A case for JK is made in the first two chapters.  The other two chapters defend views about testimony and inference, with arguments that are largely independent of JK.  A main topic of the chapter on testimony is acquiring knowledge of a proposition from the testimony of one who knows it.  This is held to require knowing that the testifier knows the proposition (KK).  A main topic of the chapter on inference is good inference, good in that it has the most important epistemic virtue for an inference.  This is held to be an inference that derives knowledge of the conclusion from knowledge of the premises (GIK).  As Sutton well knows, GIK has the striking implication that no good inference has a false conclusion.

Other extraordinary epistemic positions are defended along the way.  One noteworthy thesis is about evidence that someone has in support of a proposition.  Evidential support is held to be knowledge from which the person can know the supported proposition by inference (EK).  As Sutton well knows, EK has the striking implications that no one has evidence in support of a false proposition and that someone's evidence for a proposition cannot merely confirm or indicate the proposition's truth to the person.


How well can one who upholds JK account for the many apparent cases of justification without knowledge?  To this end, Sutton makes use of some probability propositions.  He takes the notion of probability as a primitive, explained only as epistemic and subject-relative. (12)  To account for Gettier cases such as the Ford case, Sutton suggests that the protagonist has knowledge that some colleague probably owns a Ford, but not a justified belief that some colleague does own a Ford. (66)  Similarly he explains beliefs on explicitly statistical grounds, such as beliefs in lottery-losing propositions, and beliefs in theories on explanatory grounds.  These too he takes to be cases in which there is knowledge of probabilities.  He holds that in such examples we are speaking loosely when we attribute justification to belief in a proposition, rather than to belief in a proposition asserting its probability.  The nearby strict truth is knowledge of its probability. (11, 63-67)

These accounts are not psychologically plausible.  Knowledge requires belief.  We appear usually not to have any sort of probability in mind in the relevant cases.  Sutton makes a contrary claim.  He claims, "S believes that p entails that S believes that probably p." (67)  But this entailment does not hold.  If it did, then for any belief that we had, B, we would also have all beliefs of the forms: probably B, probably probably B, etc.  We do not believe all of those propositions.  Just for one thing, we are unable to consider any proposition with a few thousand probability iterations (personally speaking, the incapacity arises somewhat earlier).

This difficulty might be avoidable.  It might be claimed that in the cases of apparent justification without knowledge, we are at least in a position to know the probability proposition.  In some such cases the belief is lacking.  Nevertheless, the person's readiness to know the probably-B proposition is the strict truth that we loosely invoke by attributing a justified belief in B.

This mildly revised account of the neighboring strict truth may solve the psychological problem with no loss of plausibility.  There is a less tractable problem.  The intuitive data about epistemic justification include the appearance that it varies in strength.  Sutton does not discuss strength of justification.  The simplest extension of his sort of account would say that someone apparently has stronger justification for one proposition than for another when the person is in a position to know a higher probability of the one proposition than of the other.

The concept of probability in this purported knowledge needs explanation.  Many cases of intuitively stronger justification include no overtly statistical source that might give content to probability propositions.  This is illustrated by countless examples of apparently stronger justification via clearer perceptions and more vivid memories.  It is not clear what sort of comparative probabilities might be known in such cases.

Furthermore, another intuitive datum about epistemic justification is that attitudes other than belief can be justified, such as suspending judgment on a proposition or having a doubt about it.  Sutton does not discuss the justification of these attitudes.  The simplest extension of his account explains their justification in a way that relies on being in a position to know other probability propositions.  The strict fact in a justified suspension case would be something like the fact that the person is in a position to know that the proposition and its negation are equi-probable.  In a justified doubt case, the strict fact would be something like the fact that the person is in a position to know of something that makes the proposition significantly improbable.  These further probability claims reinforce the importance of having some explanation of the concept.

One plausible explanation uses strength of evidential support.  The degree of epistemic probability of a proposition for someone is determined by the strength of its support by the evidence that the person has.

EK, the advocated view of evidential support, disallows this evidentialist account.  EK requires that evidence in support of a proposition for someone is capable of giving the person inferential knowledge of the proposition.  This excludes the existence of weakly supporting evidence, inadequate for knowledge, which might make for lower probabilities.

Accounting as Sutton does for apparently justified attitudes that are not knowledge relies on extensive appeal to propositions asserting probabilities.  It is not clear what propositions they might be.  This constitutes a serious explanatory deficit.


The first chapter of the book takes up five conceptions of epistemically justified belief.  Four are argued to be equivalent to knowledge.  The fifth conception, reasonable belief, is acknowledged not to be coextensive with knowledge.  Reasonableness is argued to be unfit to play the role in the analysis of knowledge that traditional epistemologists have assigned to epistemic justification. (14-15)

Reasonableness of a sort seems well qualified to be epistemic justification.  For instance, it is plausible that its strength varies in tandem with epistemic justification.  It is plausible that the epistemic types of reasonableness and justification are distinguished by the same bearing of evidence: justifications and reasons are specifically epistemic when they derive from the person's evidence.  In light of such intuitive credentials of justification as reasonableness, the alleged liabilities merit critical attention.

The reasonableness of a belief is claimed to be a derivative concept and one that is defined in terms of knowledge.  Such definitions are proposed.  Having such a definition, reasonableness cannot be used to define a concept of justification that helps to define knowledge.  Yet it is a concept of justification that defines knowledge that is of traditional epistemological interest. (35-36)

There are some important theses about justification as reasonableness that this critique does not jeopardize.  It remains open that the justification that mainly interests contemporary epistemologists is a sort of reasonableness.  A sort of justification might be central to rationality, whatever its connection to knowledge.  Justification as reasonableness seems to contribute to making rational beliefs, inferences, and choices and it seems to differ in strength in ways that make stronger reasons better ones in these roles.  None of this depends on whether the reasonableness can participate in a definition of knowledge.  Equally, none of this depends on whether the reasonableness is primarily true of belief, or only derivatively true of it.

The critique also leaves it open that knowledge entails reasonableness.  Suppose that reasonable belief has a definition that somehow involves knowledge.  Still, being reasonably believed may be a necessary condition for being known.  It is possible for one concept to be defined in terms of another, while the one is a necessary condition for the other.  For instance, audibility can be defined as a capacity to be heard, while being audible is a necessary condition for being heard.  The necessity of justification for knowledge, rather than any purported definition, may explain why justification construed as reasonableness is a central epistemic concept.

Moreover, the proposed definitions of reasonableness using knowledge are objectionable.  The first one says that for a person to be reasonable is for the person's belief-forming faculties and habits to be such as to deliver knowledge when conditions are right. (35-36)  Rightness of conditions is not explained, but remarks about luck (9, 20, 88) suggest that this rightness is a matter of circumstances making the belief true in a way that does not create a Gettier case.  The other definition says that for a belief to be reasonable in its circumstances is for the belief to be one that a reasonable person would or could hold in those circumstances. (36)

The definition of a reasonable person is too demanding.  For a person to be epistemically reasonable, it is enough that the person's attitudes are held in accordance with the person's evidence.  For instance, suppose that a reasonable person knows about an election only that several good polls give a certain candidate a slight lead.  The person thus has a balance of evidence favoring that the candidate will win.  This is an adequate basis for a reasonable person to believe that the candidate will win.  Yet if the candidate will in fact win and there is no Gettier funny business, the belief still is not strongly enough supported to be knowledge.  So knowledge does not arise even when conditions are right.  The definition proposed therefore denies that a person who has the described belief on the described basis is reasonable.  That seems wrong.

Also, the belief itself is a reasonable one, when held on the basis of the poll information.  The account of reasonable belief denies this.  The poll information does not give knowledge of the winner even when conditions are right.  So it is not a belief that a reasonable person, as defined, could have in the circumstances.  The definition of reasonable belief therefore implies that it is not a reasonable belief.  That seems wrong.  The circumstances that make for reasonable belief need not make for knowledge, no matter how right are the conditions.  Epistemic reasons can be good ones without being that good.

There is no need to appeal to knowledge, or to a reasonable person, in order to explain a reasonable belief.  In fact, attractive explanations go in the other direction.  A person's epistemically justified beliefs are the epistemically reasonable ones.  Those are the ones supported by a balance of the person's epistemic reasons.  Those reasons are the person's evidence.  An epistemically reasonable person is one who sufficiently tends to have reasonable attitudes.  Knowledge is sufficiently reasonable belief when conditions are right.  The part of this explanatory package that takes justification to be reasonableness seems to work well.


Four arguments are given in the second chapter for JK, the thesis that justified belief is knowledge.  Their premises are independent of one another.  The arguments are complex, original, and provocative.  None of them seems costly to resist, however.

The first argument will serve as an example.  It essentially argues that an assertion of a justified true belief does such good epistemic work that it must be an assertion of knowledge.  Here is the full argument, lightly paraphrased.

The first premise is "the knowledge rule":

(1) An assertion is entirely proper -- in a word, impeccable -- only if it asserts knowledge.

The reasoning assumes, for reductio ad absurdum:

(2) JTB is some justified true belief of Andy's that he does not know.

Another premise:

(3) Andy asserts JTB to Bob and Bob knows the content of Andy's assertion, JTB, to be a justified belief of Andy's.

Another premise:

(4) Bob accepts JTB by receiving Andy's testimony.

The next premise is supposed to be at least strongly supported, if not entailed, by (2)-(4):

(5) By accepting Andy's testimony of JTB, Bob acquires a belief in JTB that is epistemically impeccable.

In further defense of premise (5) it is claimed that Bob becomes "healthier, wealthier, and wiser" as a result of his acceptance of JTB.

The final premise is this:

(6) Only an impeccable assertion transmits an impeccable belief.

From (1), (5), and (6), is inferred:

(7) The assertion of JTB is an assertion of knowledge.

(7) Implies:

~(2) (That is, the reductio assumption that Andy's belief in JTB is merely a justified true belief, and not knowledge, is false.)

A final inference is made from ~(2) to the conclusion:

(8) Andy's JTB belief is justified only if he knows JTB. (44-46)

Premise (5) is inadequately supported.  Bob's accepting JTB from testimony that is only a justified true belief of Andy's, which Bob knows to be justified, could result in Bob's having only a justified true belief in JTB, not an impeccable belief.  As for the claim that Bob becomes healthier, wealthier, and wiser as a result, the truth of JTB could make Bob healthier and wealthier.  As for wisdom, the status of the JTB belief as a Gettier case would make Bob fail to gain knowledge, and Bob would not be wise to that.

Another weakness in this reasoning is premise (6) -- the claim that only impeccable assertion transmits[1] impeccable belief.  Not so.  Suppose that you know that I wishfully accept and confidently assert any positive claim about spinach that comes to my attention.  You also know of some remarkable circumstances that have arisen, namely, that the wildly irresponsible tabloid that I like to read will today inadvertently publish some actual fact or other about spinach.  I have read the spinach claim and asserted it to you.  You know that under these conditions I asserted something favorable about spinach only if it is true.  This knowledge, with your acceptance of my assertion, gives you an epistemically impeccable belief in its content.  Yet I did not have a reasonable basis for my spinach claim, much less was it an impeccable assertion.  Thus, contrary to (6), in the right circumstances a faulty assertion can transmit an impeccable belief.

This objection to (6) does not immediately refute KK, the main thesis of the chapter on testimony.  KK is the claim that what is required, to gain knowledge from an assertion by one who does know, is knowing that the asserter knows.  The objection to (6) is a case of gaining knowledge from an assertion by one who does not know, or even reasonably believe.  But if the objection works, then similar cases show that KK is also untrue.  Contrary to KK, in order to gain knowledge from an assertion by one who knows, we do not have to know that the asserter knows.  It is enough that we know that the content is asserted only if it is true.


Without Justification poses useful challenges to epistemological orthodoxy.  Doughty defenses of dissident doctrines deserve deference.  At their worst, they can occasion a display of strength by an intellectual tradition.  At their best, they give us a Copernican revolution.

[1] The word "transmit" in (6) is being read to mean, "convey the content of."  If "transmit" in (6) is read to imply "sustain the quality of," then (6) is true.  Impeccable belief has to have an impeccable source to be a case of sustaining its source's quality.  But then the inference employing (6) to derive (7) is invalid.  Bob's impeccable belief from Andy's testimony need not have been a case of quality "transmission."  A testimonial belief can gain quality at the receiving end, as in the following example.