Without Offending Humans: A Critique of Animal Rights

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Élisabeth De Fontenay, Without Offending Humans: A Critique of Animal Rights, Will Bishop (tr.), University of Minnesota Press, 156pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780816676057.

Reviewed by Tzachi Zamir, The Hebrew University of Jerusalem


Élisabeth De Fontenay dislikes analytic philosophy. She opposes it to "the great metaphysical tradition and its deconstruction" (continental philosophy). The subject of her book is animals. The chapters are not part of an integrated argument, but rather discrete essays that probe various aspects of the animal question. Topics include, for example, the various meanings of deconstructing the human/animal divide (chapter 1), or the relationship between zoophilia and xenophobia (chapter 4), bio-art (chapter 6), as well as attempts to delineate the distinctiveness of the human (chapters 2 and 5). Only one of the book's seven chapters is an explicit "critique of animal rights" as promised by the book's subtitle (at least in its English translation -- the original French subtitle, "réflexions sur la cause animale" is less polemical in tone). But given the publisher's wish to center-stage De Fontenay's critique of rights, it is only just to devote this review to this critique.

De Fontenay resists the cross-disciplinary pressure to blur the line between human and non-human animals -- the point of her book is to discuss animals "without offending humans." She perceives the philosophical extension of this line -- calls for attributing rights to animals -- as fundamentally distorted and possibly immoral. The targets of her criticism are "analytic" philosophers Peter Singer and Paola Cavalieri, who in her view exemplify the combination of naïve method and diminished sensitivities that lead humans to misapprehend their own uniqueness (which, for her, as for so many others, resides in humans attaining a complex language).

What remains with the reader of De Fontenay's critique (which I shall immediately describe), is not the insubstantiality of her arguments, but the much more troubling thought that this weakness reveals a more significant phenomena. De Fontenay has not taken the trouble to seriously understand the issues and motivations that underlie the tradition she is so eager to dismiss. She exhibits philosophical indifference to questions relating to private and collective obligations that issue from moral sensitivities with regard to animals. Should animals be eaten? Should they be used for 'products'? Should they be exhibited in zoos or circuses? Such practices that concern billions of animals are not the real issue for De Fontenay (as they are for Singer or Cavalieri) -- reading the "great metaphysical tradition" is. Indeed, like the person who seems to be her greatest influence -- Jacques Derrida -- De Fontenay is a reader. Her philosophical agency is accordingly restricted to acts of reading. Ask her a straight question ("Is it justified to keep a pet?" "Is an experimenter obliged to rehabilitate an animal that survives the experiment?"), and she will treat you to a reading of Heidegger, Husserl or Lévi-Strauss. More worldly mobilizations of one's philosophical agency in the context of animals -- direct examination and critique of institutional practices and their underlying conceptual assumptions, carefully argued agendas for moral resistance in particular spheres, setting the scope of reform through distinct proposals -- are no part of this book. At the two points in the book in which she does condemn a practice (bio-art and the excessive slaughter of cows suspected of carrying mad cow disease), the nature of her demand remains a vague pointer. One realizes that she objects to something, but practical consequences that follow from such resistance -- indeed, the specific objection as such -- are not formulated.

Derrida would have approved. His own The Animal that therefore I am suffers from the same combination of confessed sensitivity to animal suffering that, heartfelt as it is, springboards nothing but meditations -- some more interesting than others -- regarding the human-animal divide. While De Fontenay assures her reader that Derrida did not avoid personal action (he was, she tells us, an honorary president of an anti-bullfighting group), one would have hoped that such a guiding light for so many philosophers would have selected a form of activism that is somewhat riskier and more personally taxing than opposing bullfighting (in Paris!). No philosopher should object to thoughts regarding the human/animal distinction, obviously, but the inability to harness such readings to philosophically guided moral action in an attempt to correct injustice and reduce suffering (worse, the attempt to trivialize or de-legitimize these as is attempted by De Fontenay), is perhaps indicative of a greater shortcoming of post-humanist thought when it simplistically presents itself as an alternative to Anglo-American philosophy.

Responsible for this stuttering is an under-theorized contradiction between two central prongs of post humanism: on the one hand, it is skeptical with regard to truth-talk, especially when it is seemingly dissociated from power. It accordingly avoids argumentative methods that proceed as if justification can be restricted to arguments. This explains De Fontenay's disdain for the argumentative style of Cavalieri and Singer. On the other hand, we have post-humanism's greatest moral achievement: a keen attention to hidden forms of suffering and to practices of marginalization. In these, ultimately, an a-historical, cross-cultural premise regarding suffering and the moral urgency of speaking for it is being assumed. The latter (moral) prong is indebted precisely to the type of utilitarianism that Singer stands for, and it is precisely this utilitarianism that De Fontenay briskly dismisses as nothing more than a quantitative calculus. Missing from her account is any awareness that utilitarianism is not only an attempt to maximize pleasure, but also -- or even primarily -- an obligation to minimize suffering in a way that is impartial to one's own privileged placement.

De Fontenay's first relatively detailed argument against defenders of animal rights tries to render morally irrelevant the scientific literature to which these authors appeal when they blur the divide between humans and non-humans. Her argument is basically a variant of the Is/Ought claim cast as a dissociation between metaphysics and science: obligations to fellow humans, rights, and a sense of a shared moral community are, she says, bestowed, rather than derived from descriptive observations. Her second point amounts to arguing for the insensitivity and inhumanity of Singer's arguments regarding similar capacities in some incapacitated humans and some animals. She finally faults Cavalieri for focusing on the animal-experimentation aspect of the Nuremberg code, and ignoring the human-oriented import of a decision never to experiment on humans, but only on animals (implicitly, Cavalieri is blamed for belittling the Holocaust).

Animal ethicists will easily pick out several confusions and misreadings that appear to underlie such claims. I will not, however, catalogue them here. These are mostly rooted in De Fontenay's having accessed the tradition she criticizes in a strikingly limited manner, thereby missing highly detailed discussions regarding the relationship between biology and ethics and the basis of moral entitlement. She refers to Singer's Animal Liberation and to a paper, in French, by Cavalieri. But most of what she seems to base her argument upon is a secondary source, a book by Jean-Yves Goffi (Le Philosophe et ses animaux), in which the English debate is described for a French readership. She is, for example, unfamiliar with Cavalieri's book on rights, and she regards Singer as an advocate of animal rights, misunderstanding the insignificance of this term for him, as opposed to the substantive argument for animal rights proposed by Regan, Cavalieri (in her book), or Steven Wise. She accordingly runs together utilitarian and rights-based approaches, without sensing their different underpinnings. As for animal-liberation arguments within Anglo-American ethics that are not based on ascribing rights, (e.g, DeGrazia, Sapontzis, Nussbaum or my own Ethics and the Beast which -- precisely as De Fontenay desires -- defends animal liberation without a prior requirement to dismantling speciesism) these are simply unmentioned. All are, for her, interchangeable variants of the same de-humanizing stance, the same a-historical, casuistic, logic-chopping philosophy that slavishly follows science and that can be safely disregarded by readers of "the great metaphysical tradition and its deconstruction."

Apart from the implications with regard to De Fontenay's critique, the saddening thought is that there is something symptomatic in this flaw. The insulation of French philosophy, often marketed as a thoughtful dismissal of the ideals that underlie Anglo-American philosophy, is in fact rooted in nothing loftier than a systematic disregard for linguistically inaccessible literature. Singer's Animal Liberation was translated into French almost twenty years after its publication. Regan's The Case for Animal Rights is only now appearing in French, thirty years after its publication. Judging from a brief exchange with fellow animal-ethicists, second and third wave contributions to the animal debate in English are not even about to appear in French. Why? Are the detailed discussions within animal ethics of topics such as moral considerability, kinds of speciesism, interests, types of equality, intrinsic moral value, and many others, simply being absorbed by those who take animals seriously, in a country with such powerful philosophical presence and international influence as France? If De Fontenay exemplifies the current state, the answer is a resounding 'no'.

That the point of this is not merely to lament parochialism is apparent when we come to De Fontenay's constructive alternative to what she perceives as the inhumanity of extending rights to animals. She puts her confidence in fellow-feeling, in a pathocentrism, in which the vulnerability and suffering that one shares with animals becomes the basis of one's moral outlook (p. 67; 108). The claim is substantive, though it has been raised by others before (Cora Diamond, Martha Nussbaum and even Derrida). But to suggest that such awareness of shared pain can substitute for more principled approaches -- as De Fontenay does -- is to regressively return animal ethics into an extension of sentimental care for animals. It is (arguably) the lasting collective achievement of animal ethics from Singer on to show that the treatment of animals should not be limited to momentary spurts of compassion for cute and furry animals. Animal ethics should, rather, offer a conceptually disciplined framework through which moral restrictions on what may be institutionally done to members of other species can be evaluated and generated. Even brief familiarity with the literature that seems to have been systematically kept out of France, would have brought home to De Fontenay the way the animal debate no longer revolves around how someone happens to feel, but has been forcefully imported into the moral vocabulary that is used in human-to-human contexts, questioning the justification of excluding animals from some such applications. She would have also no doubt realized the moral danger of limiting oneself to awareness of a shared mortality and weakness, and that, important as this awareness is, restricting oneself to such confessions risks suppressing a much more far-reaching reform that may be called for.

The book is part of The University of Minnesota Press Posthumanities series, edited by Cary Wolfe. The series is an important initiative, since it establishes a forum for continental-inspired thoughts on animals. Such a platform is valuable, because, despite (justified) reservations regarding its rhetoric and the pervasive suspicion of pseudo-profoundity, some of the work published in France has provided a keen and sensitive understanding of the interpenetration of material conditions and conceptual networks, of ideas and ideology, of practices and self-identification, of ethics and forms of exclusion and disempowerment, and of the evasive modalities of complaint and the varieties of unregistered suffering. These insights are potentially world-transforming moral achievements, and they should inform and shape pro-animal intervention. A lasting contribution coming from this tradition, one that the Posthumanities series should seek out and enable, would meaningfully integrate such insights with what has been achieved in another substantial philosophical tradition. Dismissal and polarizing one's readership into clearly bounded sub-disciplinary affiliations is short-sighted, is likely to be intellectually flawed, and is ultimately detrimental to animals.