Wittgenstein after His Nachlass

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Nuno Venturinha (ed.), Wittgenstein after His Nachlass, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 203 pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230232662.

Reviewed by Oskari Kuusela, University of East Anglia


Wittgenstein After His Nachlass is a collection of essays on philological and philosophical issues relating to Wittgenstein's literary remains. The focus of some chapters is exclusively philological in that they, for example, simply describe recently discovered Wittgenstein-materials. Others focus on the significance of the Nachlass for the interpretation of Wittgenstein's philosophy and the role it should play in exegesis, including questions relating to the editing of his so-called works from it. Thus, while the chapters of the latter type address pertinent -- albeit sometimes neglected -- issues relating to the methodology of Wittgenstein-interpretation, the more purely philological chapters contribute to such aims less directly. To mention some relevant methodological problems for Wittgenstein-interpretation, his style of writing in remarks has sometimes invited his readers to make free use of any remark anywhere in the text corpus that seems to support their favoured interpretation, disregarding any questions about, for instance, how the context of the remark and/or the time of its writing might affect its interpretation. This approach is obviously problematic in the crude form of so-called passage hunting. More subtle, potentially problematic, forms of it exist too, as discussed below with reference to the contributions by Peter Hacker and David Stern. Issues relating to the employment of the Nachlass are intimately connected with other interpretative questions concerning Wittgenstein's philosophical approach since the sort of interpretive conclusions one regards as appropriate to draw from a remark of Wittgenstein's partly depends on how one understands the philosophical purpose of his remarks generally or the aims of his writing or his philosophical approach.

Let me start with the more directly philological contributions. The book begins with an introduction to the editorial disputes relating to Wittgenstein's Nachlass, and a discussion of the nature of the Nachlass and its significance for Wittgenstein-interpretation. These are issues that anyone working on Wittgenstein should be aware of, and although one might perhaps understandably struggle to find the time to read the original contributions to these philological debates, here they are concisely and conveniently summarized. (On the other hand, to someone already familiar with the relevant points and debates, the introduction doesn't have much new to offer.)

As Venturinha observes, Wittgenstein at his death left the copyright of his writings to selected students with instructions to publish whatever they saw fit. But the publication of these works, starting with the Philosophical Investigations, has sometimes involved highly significant editorial decisions and interventions that are not properly explained. As a result, the editing contributed to a misleading image of Wittgenstein as the author of completed works, which in turn may have problematically affected the interpretation of his philosophy. If the materials from which the works were compiled were not intended to express any definitive and/or consistent views on a particular subject but rather to the task of examining its different aspects, then it is problematic to present them as anything else. A case in point: it has been argued (see Josef Rothhaupt's contribution) that Wittgenstein's typescript TS 213 (the so-called Big Typescript) from which his Philosophical Grammar was edited was really only meant as an archive of remarks, not a book to be published. This illustrates that questions about the intended purpose of the items in Wittgenstein's Nachlass (his individual remarks and the larger wholes they constitute) have bearing on decisions as to what and how to publish from it, for example, whether it is correct to treat the Nachlass as a collection of uncompleted but potentially completable works.

A related desire to present Wittgenstein's writings in a conventional way, i.e., as focused on particular topics such as the philosophy of mathematics, philosophy of psychology, colours, and certainty, has arguably led, in some cases, to obscuring connections between different topics. Examples are On Certainty and Remarks on Colour which were extracted from the very same manuscripts but presented as if the discussions were entirely independent. But it is not evident that we are correct if we make this assumption of independence.

Behind these editorial and philological issues lie questions about Wittgenstein's philosophical method: whether his remarks are intended to constitute something like a philosophical theory or a systematic account of language use, or whether they serve some other purposes. It is in this and related ways that philological and editorial issues connect with questions of interpretation. Here there is a risk of a vicious spiral where misleading editing contributes to problematic exegesis. Thankfully, however, this problem in Wittgenstein-editorship has now been fixed. For while its earlier stages seem like a learning process towards a greater awareness of potential problems, with the Bergen Electronic Edition (2000; BEE) the publication of Wittgenstein's writings has reached an exemplary level of transparency. (The further development of the BEE is discussed in the volume; see below.) The BEE makes Nachlass items available in different formats, some of which are designed to enable the reader to get as close to Wittgenstein's original text and to provide as much information as possible regarding Wittgenstein's revision of his texts. The BEE is also a highly flexible publication format in the sense that it is relatively easy to add new materials to it when such materials emerge. Two such new sets of source materials are described in the book (see the chapters by Arthur Gibson and Volker Munz respectively): the notes and dictations taken by Francis Skinner (with corrections and additions by Wittgenstein himself) and very thorough and extensive lecture notes by Yorick Smythies of which Wittgenstein himself said that he wished them to be published. (Skinner and Smythies were students and close friends of Wittgenstein.) Whether these materials would be appropriately included as part of the Nachlass is not clear, but certainly they are of great interest. For example, yet another item is added to the well-known dictations by Wittgenstein from the 1930s, besides the so-called Blue and Brown Books and The Yellow Book: The Pink Book. (The Brown Book is also to be revised and expanded on the basis of Skinner materials.)

The electronic format of the BEE is also well suited for tracing back Wittgenstein's revisions of his remarks and keeping track of their different versions. For in effect Wittgenstein's practice of extensive revision calls for interpreters to deal with many layers of text, making the task of interpretation multidimensional. As explained by Alois Pichler in the last chapter of the volume, dedicated to the preparation of a new version of the BEE, the electronic publication platform offers various possibilities for further development, such as interactive editing, where the readers can themselves decide how the texts will be filtered from the underlying machine readable text-base, the possibility of including metadata about the different versions of Wittgenstein's remarks, and even enriching the Nachlass with commentary texts as well as biographical and historical-cultural material. Which of these possible improvements and additions, besides other more straightforward improvements, should be incorporated into the new version is still a matter of discussion. But there certainly are reasons to be very happy with the BEE as a research tool. Given Wittgenstein's view that in philosophy the deformities of one's thought shouldn't be hidden but exposed, he himself would presumably have welcomed -- if not demanded -- maximal editorial transparency of the kind BEE has made possible.

The borderline between philological and philosophical issues is blurred in a number of the volume's essays. An example is Luciano Bazzocchi's discussion of Wittgenstein's organization of the text of the so-called Prototractatus (an earlier manuscript of the Tractatus): how he composed the text and what light that composition throws on his thought. Although the discussion in this chapter is partly purely philological, the principles according to which Wittgenstein organized his text also have interpretative significance. The situation is similar in the case of Ilse Somavilla's discussion of Wittgenstein's remarks written in code and his possible reasons for using code. As she explains, although Wittgenstein's coded remarks are mostly on ethics, aesthetics, religion or are personal/autobiographical in nature, and may have been written in code simply to separate philosophical discussions from private discussions, their relation to remarks not in code seems more complicated than this. For example, there are coded remarks on his philosophical practice, and sometimes issues originally discussed in code are taken up for non-coded philosophical discussion. So the question arises what grounds lie behind Wittgenstein's use of code? What might the answer reveal, for instance, about what he regarded as philosophical topics proper, and how he understood the relation between the personal and philosophical? Did he see these as two different levels of writing?

I had difficulties understanding Somavilla's suggestion that the coded remarks might be on issues Wittgenstein regarded as ineffable. For, if we are talking about what the Tractatus regarded as unsayable, aren't these mostly issues at the core of his philosophizing? Similarly it remains unclear why a code would be a more appropriate expression for something ineffable than normal writing. Nevertheless, a very interesting suggestion is that Wittgenstein's coded discussions of ethics, aesthetics and religion can be seen as constituting a book to be construed out of the Nachlass that extends beyond remarks on these topics collected in Culture and Value.

A third chapter of this type is Rothhaupt's discussion of Wittgenstein's style of writing in remarks, explaining what the purpose and aims of this style of writing are and what kind of larger wholes his remarks are meant to constitute. (Rothhaupt also discusses the notion of a book closely related to that described by Somavilla, except now relevant remarks would be identified with a special 'Kringel-sign' [a circular scribble] that Wittgenstein used for the purpose. This book would also contain discussions of anthropology and the philosophy of anthropology.) Rothhaupt emphasizes the importance of the Nachlass for understanding Wittgenstein: his notebooks are apt to reveal the process of philosophical struggle that is easily concealed in a more finished text. In this way the Nachlass can -- if the role of remarks in it is properly understood -- be very instructive or even indispensable to interpreters.

Similarly, in his essay, Venturinha stresses the importance of knowledge of the Nachlass for interpretation, agruing on philological grounds to an exegetical conclusion. He opposes the recent suggestion that there is, in addition to the early and later Wittgenstein, a third Wittgenstein whose work -- above all, what is known as On Certainty -- constitutes a significant departure from the Philosophical Investigations. The postulation of a third Wittgenstein is problematic, Venturinha reasons, both because the argument in its support assumes the Investigations to be a complete and finished work, which it arguably is not, and because it ignores Wittgenstein's earlier writings in the 1930s on topics discussed in On Certainty.

Finally, three chapters of the book are more directly philosophical, although they too are focused on the significance of the Nachlass for interpreting Wittgenstein. The first is Hacker's discussion of the private language argument, i.e., whether Wittgenstein is committed to a conception of language as only in principle shareable or by necessity actually shared (a communal view of language). Hacker doesn't really say anything different here from the interpretation he and Gordon Baker articulated in the 1980s and 1990s in connection with a debate with Norman Malcolm. What makes Hacker's contribution particularly interesting is the way it contrasts with Stern's. Hacker assumes, on the basis of remarks from the Nachlass, that if Wittgenstein accepted a particular view as unobjectionable in some context, then it must have been generally unobjectionable to him. Stern, however, contests that assumption, arguing that Wittgenstein felt and acknowledged a pull to both philosophical theorizing and a Pyrrhonian critique of theorizing, moving back and forth between them. According to Stern, Wittgenstein's post-1936 writings on private language represent a fresh take on how the issue should be approached (the right tone and style). In those writings his philosophizing becomes an examination of possible ways of understanding philosophical views and a dialogue with 'opposing voices', rather than of arguments for and against philosophical views. It isn’t obvious which thinker is right about these issues regarding the interpretation of Wittgenstein on private language. Hacker's and Stern's dialogue raises important questions about the use of the Nachlass that any interpreter of Wittgenstein should be aware of. A more directly philosophical contribution is Joachim Schulte's engaging chapter on Wittgenstein on concept formation and Wittgenstein's conception of the relation between concepts and facts or experience, including the notion of something striking us as natural and its relation to what we regard as logically necessary.

The volume contains as appendices two short pieces by Wittgenstein that are edited by Venturinha: 'Ramsey's Notes on Time and Mathematics' and 'Wittgenstein's 1938 Preface' to his projected book. The Ramsey text was originally written in German and is translated here for the first time. The preface is a translation from 1938.

Overall, I found the book an interesting read, even though not very rich in philosophical content. Some purely philological chapters don't really have philosophical content, but simply convey information about new Wittgenstein-materials or discuss editorial possibilities. This is not a book, it seems, to which one returns over and over, for example, as a source of inspiration. Nevertheless, it certainly deserves its place in Wittgenstein-literature, especially due to its promotion of greater awareness and methodological rigour in the employment of source materials.