Wittgenstein and Ethical Inquiry: A Defense of Ethics as Clarification

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J. Jeremy Wisnewski, Wittgenstein and Ethical Inquiry: A Defense of Ethics as Clarification, Continuum, 2007, 150pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826487742.

Reviewed by Darlei Dall'Agnol, Federal University of Santa Catarina and CNPq


Wisnewski's book is a genuine attempt to make a contribution to moral philosophy and not just an exegetical work on Wittgenstein's ethics. The book takes a broadly Wittgensteinian approach, but, more importantly, it aims at making a point about the place morality or normativity has in our lives and in our understanding of the world as a whole. I will divide this review into two parts: first, I will reconstruct his main ideas, assessing some of them; and second I will explain my major disagreement with him.

Wisnewski correctly understands ethical inquiry, from a Wittgensteinian point of view, as aiming at clarification, particularly, conceptual clarification, and not at constructing an ethical theory. Throughout his life, from the Tractatus to his very last works, Wittgenstein rejected any theoretical account of morality which would proceed by trying to offer real definitions of 'good', 'right', etc., explanations of what one must do, assertions about what is best for an individual to seek in his life, or metaphysical statements about whether moral judgments are real propositions (that is, can be true or false), whether there are moral facts independent of our form of life, whether ethics can be a science, whether ethics has objective foundations, and so on. To discard all these misunderstandings of moral phenomena, however, doesn't mean that moral judgments are not extremely important in our lives. Here, again, Wisnewski gets things right: Wittgenstein is not a quietist. In fact, he wants us to speak morally as long as we do not attach something else to our moral judgments, for example, what is constitutive of our empirical propositions, of our descriptive language-games. Here I completely agree with Wisnewski (see my paper "What we cannot say, we can and sometimes must speak about", Papers of the 27th International Wittgenstein Symposium). Philosophy itself, free from metaphysical confusions, can help us see what is constitutive of our moral language games including such things as the imperative characteristic of most of our ordinary moral judgments. To clarify what morality is really all about is a worthy task for philosophy. More importantly, it can show us how we can live better by, for example, showing how to reach peace of mind when all metaphysical pseudo-problems are explained away. Conceptual clarification has intrinsic value and may accomplish something (pace 'critical theorists'' such as Marcuse's misunderstandings of Wittgenstein's work): it must change the way we live and such changes are Wittgenstein's main philosophical goal.

With this view clearly stated, Wisnewski invites us to rethink the history of ethics. He offers us insightful readings of Kant's and Mill's moral philosophies. He argues that Kant's Categorical Imperative should not, pace Rawls and many of his followers, be read as a procedure for establishing action-guiding rules or moral laws. On the contrary, if we take seriously Kant's method as it was practiced in the Groundwork, it is by mere analysis (or conceptual clarification) of the concept of morality that we find out that its principle is a categorical one, which commands nothing more than autonomy. Wisnewski concludes that, from a Wittgensteinian point of view, what Kant is most interested in is clarifying practical rationality, and that is the main purpose of the distinction between hypothetical and categorical imperatives (or relative and absolute values in Wittgenstein). Thus, whatever else Kant and Wittgenstein may agree on regarding, for instance, the nature of philosophical inquiry, the Categorical Imperative is a constitutive rule of the form "x counts as y in c" and not an algorithm generating all sort of duties.

Wisnewski applies the same line of thought to Mill's Principle of Utility. It is not designed to be a calculus of what is the best course of action available to the agent, but to clarify what is constitutive of human flourishing. Here I would make two critical comments. Wisnewski's Wittgensteinian readings of both Kant's Categorical Imperative and Mill's Principle of Utility do in fact manage to reach some sort of compatibilization between deontology and utilitarianism. However, in many cases, there is a clear opposition between what a deontologist and a consequentialist would do in particular circumstances. For example, a consequentialist reasoning about obligation as determined by the intrinsic value of the results of action would push a man in front of a uncontrolled train if that was the only way to save the lives of thousands, while a deontologist holds that we have a fundamental moral obligation to refrain from actions of certain kinds, particularly, killing an innocent. Whether Wisnewski's attempt to compatibilize these two ethical approaches is successful or manages to accomplish something really important requires much more discussion. Also open to discussion is whether he is successful in answering objections to his readings of both Kant and Mill, a project which cannot be undertaken in the short space of this review. Finally, and this is the only thing that I take to be a misinterpretation of Wittgenstein, Wisnewski reads Philosophical Investigations as favoring naturalism. In my opinion, Wittgenstein remained non-naturalist, perhaps even a mystic, throughout his life.

I would like now to spell out what seems to me the most problematic of the claims Wisnewski puts forward, without being, I hope, a hostile critic. Wisnewski worries about a possible objection to the Wittgensteinian understanding of ethical inquiry as conceptual analysis, that it may just articulate the preexisting value-laden perceptions of different forms of life, leading straight to relativism. Not that I disagree with Wisnewski's criticism of relativism as more than a mistake, that is, as a meta-ethical confusion. Wisnewski's attempts to secure moral knowledge, comparing it to perceptual knowledge and in fact considering it a kind of moral vision, appears to me a misunderstanding of morality, malgré Wisnewski's best intentions. I may know a tree is in front of me because I see it, but that is not the case with moral phenomena (consider, for example, knowing what is wrong with torture). To recall Wittgenstein's own example: Suppose one of us were an omniscient person and therefore knew all the movements of all the bodies in the world, dead or alive, and that he also knew all the states of mind of all human beings that ever lived. Suppose also that he wrote all he knew in a big book. This book would contain the whole description of the world, and in it we could read the description of a murder with all its details, physical and psychological. But the mere description of these facts will contain nothing which we could call an ethical proposition. Thus, either Wisnewski needs to postulate queer Platonic moral entities perceived by the mind's eye and then he cannot explain conflicting perceptions or, by seeking to secure moral knowledge as a kind of perceptual knowledge, he will fall into empiricism and will be led into judgments of relative value only. That is to say, Wisnewski is a victim of his own criticism since he assumes a Wittgensteinian approach which forbids the criss-crossing of language-games. It follows that if he wants to keep the best of his clarificatory ethics based on the idea that moral judgments are not assertions, he must give up his thesis that moral knowledge is perceptual.

I suggest an alternative account that would allow Wisnewski's Wittgensteinian project of a clarificatory ethics. Based on Wittgenstein's own distinction of types of knowledge, we may describe moral knowledge as a kind of knowing-how and not knowing-that. Note that perceptual knowledge is a subspecies of knowing-that. In his Philosophical Investigations (§ 150), Wittgenstein clarifies that the grammar of the word 'knows' is closely related to that of 'can', 'is able to'. This is the sense of 'know' that has rich implications for practical philosophy. Thus, it is possible to present a Wittgensteinian analysis of moral knowledge as a kind of knowing-how in terms of being capable of following the constitutive rules, acquired by training, which compose a specific moral practice. According to this analytical model, to have moral knowledge is a matter of knowing-how to go on following, for example, what Wisnewski identifies to be our moral primitives: that cruelty is wrong, that autonomy is valuable, that the cultivation of our talents and our humanity is something that we ought to work towards. This analysis of moral knowledge as based on knowing-how cannot be reduced to knowing-that and therefore is not mirrored in algorithms as moral formulae telling us what to do in any circumstances of our life. On the contrary, it is closer to a phenomenology of our moral life and based on the capacity for discerning, or to put it in Aristotelian terms, of having practical wisdom, which may well be more fundamental than an ethics based on, to use Wisnewski's distinction, regulative rules only. In a case of conflict between principles, in a case of a moral dilemma, we will only know-how to go on if we are capable of clarifying to ourselves what is really required of us as moral agents.

Wisnewski's greatest strength is that his clarification reaches not only the history of ethics, but also our daily morality. That is why I recommend his book to everyone interested in changing the way we view ethics, enriching our understanding of it, and thereby making a real difference in transforming our world into a better place.