Wittgenstein and Gadamer: Towards a Post-Analytic Philosophy of Language

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Chris Lawn, Wittgenstein and Gadamer: Towards a Post-Analytic Philosophy of Language, Continuum Press, 2005, 208 pp, $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826475299.

Reviewed by Robert Dostal, Bryn Mawr College


Chris Lawn's study considers the question of the relation of the philosophy of language in Gadamer and Wittgenstein and the contribution they make toward a "post-analytic" philosophy of language. This is an important set of questions and, until this book, there has been no book-length comparative study of the philosophy of language of these two figures. Wittgenstein did not and could not have known Gadamer's work in this area. Gadamer tells us that he had not seriously read Wittgenstein until after the publication of Truth and Method (1960). Though Gadamer comments in several essays on the proximity of his views about language to the views of Wittgenstein, he does not explore the connection. Coming from different contexts and with different philosophical motivations, these two thinkers appear to many, including Gadamer, to have developed convergent views, at least in part, with regard to language -- a central theme for both thinkers.

Lawn's work provides a useful discussion of the current literature on this matter, scant though it is, and nicely lays out some of the central issues in the consideration of the philosophy of language of each philosopher and their possible convergence. The book developed from a doctoral dissertation at Ireland's National University (Dublin). However much the book decries the split between "Continental" and "analytic" philosophy and hopes to contribute to a "post-analytic" philosophy of language, the book is written out of the so-called Continental tradition. Lawn reveals his hand early on when he writes: "Wittgenstein needs to be unhinged from the conventional contexts of interpretation and placed within the co-ordinates of Continental thought."(p. 3) The author displays little familiarity with analytic philosophy of language and, perhaps more importantly, of the extensive treatment within that tradition of Wittgenstein and his treatment of language. For his account of analytic philosophy of language he relies heavily on Charles Taylor and Richard Rorty. He writes in large generalities about analytic philosophy and somewhat dogmatically about analytic readings of Wittgenstein: "To read the Philosophical Investigations as a narrow forensic exploration of mental concepts misses the enormous richness of this and subsequently published works." (p. vii)

Charles Taylor's distinction between the two major traditions of the philosophy of language -- language as designative or as expressive -- provides the frame for Lawn's study. According to Lawn, Gadamer is an expressivist, while Wittgenstein turns away from his own designative account in the Tractatus (the picture theory of language) to an expressivist position in Philosophical Investigations. Lawn thus agrees with Taylor that both Gadamer and the later Wittgenstein hold expressivist theories about language. Lawn does not develop in much detail what he and Taylor mean by an expressivist theory of language. Lawn writes simply that "ultimately the purpose of language is self-expression."(p. 16) Taylor's account in two papers collected in Philosophical Papers I, "Language and Human Nature," and "Theories of Meaning," is more nuanced than Lawn's. Taylor recognizes that the view of Heidegger and Gadamer with respect to language is not simply continuous with the expressivism of the late 18th and early 19th century German romanticism. Lawn's large statement that the purpose of language ultimately is self-expression is misleading with regard to Heidegger and Gadamer. Heidegger's turn to language is at one with his attempt to leave behind subjectivity and self-consciousness. Language is, first of all, disclosive, not expressive for Heidegger and Gadamer. Lawn misstates Gadamer's debt to Heidegger for the notion that "language speaks us before we speak it," (Lawn, p. 49) when he assigns this notion to Being and Time. The notion is not to be found there but in the later writings of Heidegger on language.

What Lawn finds in common between Gadamer and Wittgenstein with regard to language is the central importance of the concept of play and the game, "an attack on isolated subjectivity" (p. 23), anti-foundationalism, an understanding of language as praxis, the rejection of private language, and the dialogical character of language (though later in the book Lawn qualifies the importance of dialogue for Wittgenstein). Two things separate Wittgenstein's philosophy of language from that of Gadamer. First, according to Lawn, Wittgenstein did not appreciate sufficiently the ramifications of the historical character of language. Secondly, Wittgenstein failed to take the hermeneutical turn. In short, Wittgenstein is insufficiently Gadamerian.

Lawn provides an adequate account of Gadamer's philosophy of language as non-instrumental, disclosive, conversational and dialogical, and so on, though his writing sometimes trips over itself. In the same paragraph (p. 55) he writes that, for Gadamer, "conversation has no telos," and that "the truth we seek is ultimately self-understanding." The latter assertion would appear to provide a telos for conversation. Understandably he is uncertain about Gadamer's relation to Plato: "It is difficult to establish precisely Gadamer's relationship to Plato."(p. 60) Lawn's attempt to clarify the speculative character of language (pp. 60-63) does not succeed. Throughout his treatment of Gadamer Lawn is clear that Gadamer rejects epistemological representationalism. Yet Lawn does not make clear how Gadamer's understanding of the mirroring aspect of language is other than representation.

The central thesis of Lawn's account of Wittgenstein's philosophy of language is that, though Wittgenstein in his later work abandoned the picture theory of language, "there is a strong sense that escape from a Tractatus model of the calculus is never finally complete." (p. 68) Lawn is critical of the rule-governed character of language games for Wittgenstein. This he contrasts with the "loose texture of the game" for Gadamer. Though the language game is considered by Wittgenstein to be a matter of custom (comparable to tradition for Gadamer), Lawn criticizes the account as insufficiently historical and insufficiently flexible. He considers Oakeshott's account of custom as open and adaptable to be appropriate to Gadamer's account of tradition but not Wittgenstein's account of the language game as custom. Typical of much, but not all, of Lawn's account is his hesitation at making the claims he does. He footnotes his claim that Wittgenstein's account of language games is insufficiently historical with the statement, "This may be too harsh a judgment." (p. 87)

To his credit Lawn consider two interpretations of Wittgenstein that go against his treatment. Lawn makes much of Wittgenstein's statement that we follow rules "blindly." (Philosophical Investigations sec. 219) According to Lawn, Wittgenstein, unlike Gadamer, distinguishes applying rules and making judgments. And, further, Wittgenstein ignores the significance of judgment and settles for the blind following of rules. Wittgenstein pointedly writes that "there is a way of grasping a rule that is not an interpretation." (Philosophical Investigations sec. 201) This is indicative, for Lawn, of Wittgenstein's failure to take the hermeneutical turn. Putnam, in "Was Wittgenstein a pragmatist?" -- an essay directed against Rorty's reading of Wittgenstein--argues that judgment was important to Wittgenstein's account in ways that Lawn denies. Putnam's argument refers us to a later section of the Investigations where Wittgenstein discusses experience and judgment, which, for him, explicitly is not a matter of technique. (p. 227) This contrasts with Wittgenstein's comment on language earlier in the Investigations that the mastery of a language is the mastery of a technique. (sec. 199) Lawn does not explore this issue as much as note it. His response to Putnam is simply to ask how Putnam can square his reading with Wittgenstein's unambiguous references to rules as imperatives. (p.80)

The second interpretation of Wittgenstein considered that differs with Lawn's is that offered in an essay by Ulrich Arnswald in the recently published Gadamer's Century (edited by Malpas, Arnswald, and Kertscher, MIT Press, 2002). Arnswald provides a more positive account of the transitory, variable, and mutable character of language games and their transformations in Wittgenstein such that he finds an "astonishing accordance" with Gadamer. (Gadamer's Century, p. 40) In response to Arnswald Lawn refers us to Habermas' critique of Wittgenstein's account of language games "monadically sealed off" and providing for a "rigid designation for its application." (See Habermas' "Review of Gadamer's Truth and Method," in Wachterhauser, Hermeneutics and Modern Philosophy, p. 249) Lawn argues that Wittgenstein's account misses the mutuality and reciprocity that are central to Gadamer's account. In sum, he writes, too vaguely and too colloquially: "there is a general failure to see the bigger picture." (p. 95)

Perhaps the most interesting part of the book is Lawn's comparison of Gadamer's and Wittgenstein's readings of Augustine. For his account of Gadamer on Augustine he relies importantly on the work of Jean Grondin and critiques what he calls the crypto-Wittgensteinian view of Augustine's philosophy of language offered by Christopher Kirwan. According to Lawn, Gadamer and Wittgenstein have opposing views about Augustine's philosophy of language. For Gadamer, Augustine provides an anti-Platonic view of language that is "proto-expressivist." (p. 112) Wittgenstein begins his Philosophical Investigations with a quotation from Augustine and presents him as one of the originators of the picture theory of language in which the primary function of words is to name things and things are defined, in the first place, ostensively. Lawn refers us to Anthony Kenny's critique of Wittgenstein's use of Augustine (in Vesey, Understanding Wittgenstein, pp. 1-13)

Finally, the book closes with a consideration of the respective accounts, or lack thereof, of poetic language. According to Lawn, for Gadamer poetic language has a certain priority over ordinary language. It best brings out the possibilities of disclosure. By way of contrast, "the Wittgensteinian silence about the poetic is significant." (p. 126) Lawn argues that language is playful for Gadamer but not for Wittgenstein. There may be "play" in Wittgenstein but it is not "playful" since it is strictly regulated, rule-governed. Lawn acknowledges the more poetic readings of Wittgenstein by Cavell and Perloff. He suggests the outlines of a "more positive case" for Wittgenstein (pp. 137-8), but he considers these attempts to throw a "lifeline" to Wittgenstein "sketchy." He then provides a brief account of Wittgenstein as a "tragic aphorist" on the model of Blaise Pascal. The work is "tragic" in the sense that it expresses a deep conflict between two voices -- each expressing diametrically opposing ways of conceiving rules, a voice of correctness and a voice of openness.

The very brief conclusion of the books speaks summarily of the slow convergence between the Continental tradition of the philosophy of language that finds a kind of culmination in Gadamer and the philosophy of language of the analytic tradition that has importantly been influenced by Wittgenstein.