Wittgenstein and Heidegger

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David Egan, Stephen Reynolds, and Aaron James Wendland (eds.), Wittgenstein and Heidegger, Routledge, 2013, 282pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415509985.

Reviewed by Timothy J. Nulty, University of Massachusetts-Dartmouth


Readers familiar with both Heidegger and Wittgenstein will find in this book detailed and thorough expressions of perhaps some of their own intuitions about the similarities and differences between these two influential twentieth-century philosophers. The sixteen essays provide insights and arguments published for the first time. Even those who consider themselves well-versed in the works of Heidegger and Wittgenstein are sure to find this book worth their time and offering new directions for future research. I'll begin with some comments on the overall significance of Wittgenstein and Heidegger followed by a more detailed examination of some specific essays.

The clarity of the chapters affords readers not familiar Heidegger or Wittgenstein an accessible yet rigorous entry into some of the most important contributions from each philosopher. Many of the essays -- especially those by Stephen Mulhall, Simon Glendinning, Denis McManus, Charles Guignon and Lee Braver -- rectify the view that Heidegger offers us nothing but conceptual rubbish, a grotesque misuse of language exemplified in page after page of mere pseudo-statement. Contrary to Carnap's view of Heidegger, and concordant with Wittgenstein's own preoccupation with language and context, we are presented with a Heidegger concerned in his own way with the basis, function and limits of "grammar". The authors show how Heidegger's use of terms like "Being" and of tautological expressions such as "The World worlds" or the "The Nothing nothings" are motivated by many of the same insights recognized by analytic philosophers as standard Wittgensteinian contributions to the philosophy of language and mind, and to philosophical methodology.

While it is likely true, speaking in general terms, that Wittgenstein has not been embraced fully by continental philosophers, there is hardly a dismissive or even hostile attitude towards his work. The situation is much different among analytic philosophers regarding their attitudes toward Heidegger's work. Of course, there are exceptions to this characterization -- the works of Richard Rorty, Robert Brandom and John Haugeland being primary examples. Receptive analytic philosophers interested in broadening their philosophical horizons would do well to include this anthology in their reading lists, along with the works of the three aforementioned philosophers. It provides an ideal entry into Heidegger's thought for those with a basic grasp of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations.

These essays are all laudable attempts at bridging the analytic-continental divide. They accomplish this rapprochement in two ways: one practical and one more properly philosophical or methodological. In practical terms, the rapprochement is accomplished simply by making the works of two philosophers from different traditions accessible to readers from either tradition. However, the essays bridge the analytic-continental divide in a much more important way by showing how both Heidegger and Wittgenstein reject many of the same traditional assumptions about what philosophy should be and how it should function.

Both traditions, despite their differences, have developed under the influence of shared assumptions about the possibility of indubitable foundations, the relationship between -- and the nature of -- subjects and objects, in addition to a common failure to appreciate fully the role of the human context. Indeed, Heidegger and the later Wittgenstein agree that the basis of intelligibility, the groundless ground of our conceptual edifice, is the everyday shared reality in which we already find ourselves. This mutual insight led both men to prioritize description over explanation or argumentation (which is not to say they did none of the latter). One must first see clearly the phenomenon in question and not begin with philosophers' myths.

The descriptions that Heidegger and Wittgenstein offer as correctives to a whole range of philosophical errors invite us to see the phenomena more accurately for ourselves, and also to see the task of philosophy differently. In the broadest terms, philosophy is about producing rational conviction, and the contributors to this anthology repeatedly demonstrate how Heidegger and Wittgenstein have a far more pluralistic and open notion of rational conviction. Neither philosopher rejects the idea that logic has an extremely important and useful role in philosophy, but neither accepts the view of logic as sovereign over all modes of thinking. Indeed, both agree that there are significant limitations to the use of formal methods, and that there are meaningful forms of philosophical expression that exceed the boundaries of the logical in some sense. Philosophy need not be argument-centric to produce rational conviction.

The analytic-continental divide is typically characterized in one of two ways: either the differences between the traditions are mostly stylistic or there are deep substantive differences, which are often framed in terms of methodology. In the latter case, one side of the divide views the other as not properly philosophical, as an illegitimate claimant to the label "philosophy". The presentations of Heidegger and Wittgenstein offer good reasons for rejecting any notion of the correct philosophical method -- a one-size-fits-all, once-and-for-all, philosophical panacea. Philosophy must be construed far more broadly than a set of assertions and the logical relations between them. There are various philosophical language games, all potentially legitimate, but no common underlying essence. This pluralism does not entail that all philosophical language-games are equally good. The contributors carefully present Heidegger's and Wittgenstein's rejections of what each believed were misguided ways of philosophizing.

Turning now to comments about specific chapters, a sensitive reader will find methodological similarities between Wittgenstein and Heidegger in nearly every essay in this volume. The essays that directly address these similarities present a challenge to those who would deny Heidegger's philosophical legitimacy. Given the deep commonalities in philosophical approach, many attempts to reject Heidegger's philosophy on methodological grounds would also undermine Wittgenstein's legitimacy -- something no competent philosopher is willing to do. I'll focus on the chapters most attentive to the manner in which Wittgenstein and Heidegger philosophized.

Mulhall argues in his "The Meaning of Being and the Possibility of Discourse" that Heidegger's fundamental ontology and Wittgenstein's examination of grammar both involve what he calls a "dialogical unity". Mulhull convincingly shows that Heidegger's concern with Being is not a symptom of metaphysical extravagance. Rather, the unity Heidegger seeks through his fundamental ontology is analogous to Wittgenstein's attempts to find an underlying linguistic unity beneath a plurality of language games. The various regions of intelligibility must be open to the influence of one another in a way analogous to the openness of participants in a conversation. The structure of conversation provides the model for the underlying unity among different regions of intelligibility -- practical or theoretical. Ultimately, Mulhall concludes that philosophy itself makes sense, as Heidegger and Wittgenstein conceived of it, if and only if the numerous regions of ordinary intelligibility, the different areas of our forms of life, can sensibly engage each other. If philosophy's aim, at least in part, is to answer broad questions -- in some sense to provide an articulated position on everything -- then its subject matter must exhibit some form of unity.

Mulhall begins by explaining how different ontic sciences can lead to the development of regional ontologies -- an account of what it means to exist as an entity in a given domain such as the chemical, the biological, the social, the mathematical, and so on. In addition, a regional ontology might tell us what makes it possible for us to grasp the nature of entities in a given domain. It is important to note that according to Heidegger the ontic sciences emerge out of our ordinary, pre-theoretical way of making sense of things when we stand back and reflect explicitly on the entities we already encounter in average everydayness. For Heidegger, all of these regional ontologies have at least one thing in common: they are interested in what it means to be a thing of a given type; they are concerned with being. The question of the meaning of being in general, as underlying all regional ontologies, is what Heidegger has in mind when he speaks of "fundamental ontology". There is both plurality in the form of multiple regional ontologies and unity arising from the fact we can ask questions about, and so make thematic, our general ability to make all kinds of different entities intelligible. That is, we can philosophize and engage in fundamental ontology.

Mulhall follows Rush Rhees in rejecting an interpretation of Wittgenstein's work that treats language as simply a family of different language-games. If the comparison with games is taken too literally, conversation (i.e., dialogical unity) is impossible. The rules that constitute one game and give the pieces in the game their meaning cannot be incorporated into another game with its own rules and meaningful pieces. Unlike actual games, language-games as different modes of human discourse can intersect with one another via conversation, and this constitutes the unity of language; it is what all language-games have in common. Importantly for Rhees (and Mulhall), the unity of language is part and parcel of the unity of a form of life.

Mulhall's essay convincingly shows how both Heidegger and Wittgenstein believe philosophical questioning is possible because of the unitary nature of our everyday understanding. Philosophy should still attempt to answer questions about the general nature of things without falling prey to the myth of a God's-eye perspective. Philosophy itself is part of the phenomenon it seeks to understand. As finite, contextualized beings the closest we can come to the infinite is to reflexively participate in the ongoing conversation that time and again will call into question the philosophical ground on which we stand.

In "Wittgenstein and Heidegger and the 'Face' of Life in Our Time," Glendinning contends, contrary to what a superficial reading of Heidegger and Wittgenstein might suggest, that Heidegger's use of the term "Being" is not susceptible to a Wittgensteinian argument that such non-ordinary uses of the term create philosophical confusion. Moreover, the content and form of Heidegger's inquiry into Being is consistent with some of Wittgenstein's central claims.

Glendinning takes his lead from Wittgenstein's view that language acts, which are not strictly meaningful, can nonetheless point to something significant. Nonsense of the right kind can be philosophically revealing. At the same time, Glendinning carefully illustrates legitimate Wittgensteinian worries that Heidegger's use of "Being" might be the result of harboring a "misconceived picture". Perhaps Heidegger has a rather odd and misleading picture regarding the use of the word "is". More specifically, perhaps Heidegger fails to note at least three distinct uses of "is": (1) as the copula, (2) as a sign for identity, and (3) as an expression of existence. Glendinning argues that none of these criticisms are well-founded once we understand the nature of Heidegger's inquiry into the meaning of Being.

He cites the Philosophical Investigations to show that Wittgenstein, like Heidegger, notes the variety of uses of the word "is". Wittgenstein asks whether these differences are merely inessential coincidences, or if they rather reveal something essential about the word "is". Indeed, for Wittgenstein, it is the uses of "is" that provide the unity; we continue to use "is", the very same word, in different ways because we appreciate the "face" of its meaning. We might even say that we recognize a family resemblance among the different uses. There is not a common core of shared semantic content among the different uses; rather it is the fact that we use the same word in different contexts that provides the unity. Hence, it is we the language users who ground the unity by using the same word for a variety of functions.

Understanding a methodological similarity between Heidegger and Wittgenstein is necessary at this point. They share the view that one major task of philosophy is to point out what we already know. This "pointing out" is an attempt to make conceptually explicit what is grasped in our everyday familiarity with things, things so close to us that they are hidden or concealed in plain view. The failure to appreciate explicitly what we already know is a source of philosophical confusion. And it is at this point, in the attempt to make explicit what we already know, that Heidegger avoids the Wittgensteinian "misconceived picture" criticism. For Heidegger, we already know what being is pre-theoretically, since we all use conjugates of the verb "to be" with competence as part of our general way of making sense of and dealing with the world. Rather than tell a philosophical story based on a traditional picture of Being (as a first cause, or unmoved mover, for example), Heidegger tries to make explicit Dasein's pre-theoretical understanding of entities as entities of various types. Heidegger's existential analytic of Dasein is a method of addressing the question of Being that does not give "being" or "is" some sort of special, non-ordinary meaning, but makes explicit the background understanding of entities, actions, and events which would then explain the linguistic and conceptual pattern created by our use of these terms and concepts. Indeed, Heidegger's claim that "Being is not a being" is an attempt to avoid treating "Being" as if it were a name for a metaphysical entity.

McManus challenges the notion that philosophical insights are always amenable to propositional form. In "The Provocation to Look and See," He identifies the way in which Heidegger and Wittgenstein both invite us to focus on the subject matter itself, rather than limiting ourselves to philosophical propositions about the phenomena.

Heidegger, McManus tells us, often criticizes other philosophers who use words in a way that is not grounded in actual experience. These words are used with "indeterminate emptiness" according to Heidegger because the philosophers using them have failed to grasp the things themselves. In Wittgensteinian terms, the focus on assertions without recognition of their uses in real world contexts abstracts them from the forms of life in which they occur and results in philosophical confusion. The danger is that one philosophizes merely about words rather than the things the words are supposed to be about. Like Wittgenstein when he criticizes various traditional philosophical views, Heidegger sees these claims not so much as false but as meaningless. Hence, both philosophers agree that superficial similarities of grammatical form can cause us to overlook important distinctions in the things about which we speak.

The correct response to confused or empty philosophical claims is neither denial nor refutation. Rather, one must somehow point out the confused or empty nature of the claim. Since the source of such philosophical confusions, according to both philosophers, is ultimately a failure to appropriate what we already know, the right response is to offer reminders. We need to bring what is hidden in the background into the foreground so that it might be utilized philosophically. We don't need more philosophical propositions, which themselves would likely contribute further to the confusion. If the perspective itself is flawed no amount of additional information, interpreted from the same perspective, can correct it. Instead, the perspective needs to be corrected.

McManus' chapter provides a clear picture of why Heidegger and the later Wittgenstein do not prioritize deductive argument. The conclusions of valid deductive arguments are only as good as the premises from which they are derived. If the premises are meaningless or confused, the arguments are at best only the appearance of philosophical progress, and at worst lead us into more confusion. We should perhaps read Heidegger and the later Wittgenstein as trying to correct the starting place from which we philosophize. Reaching that starting place is not a matter of providing additional arguments but of seeing clearly where we already are.

Guignon, in his "Wittgenstein, Heidegger, and the Question of Phenomenology," claims that although the later Wittgenstein's phenomenological approach to various philosophical topics does not come from the phenomenological tradition proper (i.e., Husserl and Heidegger), it is nonetheless concordant with major Heideggerian themes. Guignon further argues that both philosophers are challenging the traditional view of philosophy as governed by logic. Considerations regarding what we might rightly call Wittgenstein and Heidegger's shared phenomenological approach suggest a revision of our notion of philosophy itself.

Guignon highlights a number of Wittgenstein's statements that sound as if they might have been uttered by Heidegger himself: "All explanation must disappear, and description alone must take its place" (PI, §109) and "Don't think, but look!" (PI, §66). For a short period of time, Wittgenstein even referred to his work as "phenomenology". As other contributors in this anthology mention, Wittgenstein is urging us to pay attention to the phenomena themselves, rather than beginning with a misleading picture or being misled by our metaphysically loaded concepts. Our concepts mislead us because we fail to pay attention to their actual use in real world contexts. Analogously, Heidegger wants to recover the originary experiences behind the use of many of our words. Words get passed along through "idle chatter" or Gerede, and since they lack a clear connection to the originary experiences that gave the words meaning, our talk is leveled down and misleads us.

Both Heidegger and Wittgenstein intended to lay bare the background experiences, the forms of life, the worldhood of the world, that first make language meaningful. The pseudo-problems that philosophers spend much of their time confronting can be avoided by an understanding of "grammar" as Wittgenstein called it, or "logos" as Heidegger called it. Both "grammar" and "logos" refer to the deeper structures of language that are founded upon the meaningful structures of the world itself as encountered in our socially mediated dealings. The task of philosophy is to articulate these socially mediated dealings, dealings with which we are already familiar.

Braver examines Heidegger's and Wittgenstein's views of fundamental logical principles in his "Disintegrating Bugbears". Braver, with his characteristic attention to textual analysis, succeeds in showing how Wittgenstein and Heidegger gave very similar answers to questions about the basic principles that are supposed to guide our thinking. For Wittgenstein, the target of critique was the Law of Non-contradiction, while for Heidegger it was the Principle of Sufficient Reason. Both philosophers return logic and reason to the human domain. One is reminded of the American pragmatist William James and his attempt to provide an account of truth that was cognizant of the finite, contextual nature of human understanding.

Logic and reason are not transcendent to our practices; they are not answerable to "Meaning or Reason or anything metaphysical or capitalized" as Braver tell us (149). Heidegger claims, in a way not unlike Wittgenstein, that we can never stand clear of our practices of justification in order to justify those practices themselves. In giving up the transcendent as a foundation for our ways of thinking, we do not thereby find ourselves forced to accept radical cognitive relativism, in which one belief is as good as any other. In giving up a transcendent source of justification, we only lose what we never had in the first place. We give up yet another philosophical fantasy, another "picture" that cannot do the work it was intended to do. It is a world well lost, as Richard Rorty might say.

Overall, the anthology is excellent. The last four essays examine the two philosophers' thoughts on religion and art. These articles are also very good but do not focus on methodology to the same extent as the earlier articles. There are three ways in which the book could have been better: (1) contain only articles directly focused on methodology in order to attain greater uniformity of content; (2) include contributions that explore limitations in either philosopher's work and show how the other philosopher might remedy those limitations; and (3) provide detailed examinations of methodological differences and argue for the superiority of one of them.

Heidegger and Wittgenstein both suggest a new direction for philosophy, but there are differences between them. If philosophers are to heed the lessons of Wittgenstein and Heidegger, how exactly should we proceed? Where Heidegger and Wittgenstein disagree, whom should we follow and why? While these questions remain, for the most part, unanswered in this anthology, I would be delighted if the editors offered us a second volume.