Wittgenstein and His Interpreters

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Guy Kahane, Edward Kanterian, and Oskari Kuusela (eds.), Wittgenstein and His Interpreters, Blackwell, 2007, 352pp., $95.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405129220.

Reviewed by Rom Harré, Georgetown University


Over the last decade or so two major controversies have developed in the field of Wittgenstein studies. The first, and still the most prominent, concerns the quite general question of Wittgenstein's intentions in his philosophical investigations. One school of thought, the Bakerians (the late Gordon Baker was a prime exponent of this view), argued that all of Wittgenstein's studies were aimed at resolving the philosophical pathologies into which his friends and acquaintances had fallen. Each study was directed at a particular individual. So the interlocutors in the 'debates' in the Philosophical Investigations can be identified with this or that person -- not all are versions of Bertrand Russell. On Certainty is, as it seems on the surface to be, a debate with G. E. Moore. Opposed to this line are the Hackerites, of whom the most influential has been Peter Hacker himself. He holds that whatever might have been the initial prompting to look for a therapy for a philosophical malaise suffered by someone Wittgenstein knew, the results of Wittgenstein's studies are not accidentally contributions to philosophy of general import, but were intended to be. I must confess that I am a Hackerite. None the less, the therapeutic strand is there and significant. But it is a therapy for any or all of us who make use of this or that language to manage our lives.

The second debate concerns the way the whole Wittgensteinian corpus should be structured. To the two Wittgensteins, he of the Tractatus and he of the Investigations, has been added a third, the author of On Certainty and probably much of Investigations Part II. Were there one, two or three Wittgensteins? This is a convoluted question. Was the project always the same? To cure Russell of his illusion that the laws of logic were super laws of nature, to cure a great many people of the illusion that meaning is naming, to cure Moore and other analytical philosophers of the illusion that the normativity of our ways of life could be put down to the sway of grammatical rules -- in each case the project is therapeutic, but the therapy is different. The upshot is a permanent and general contribution to philosophy. For example, the Private Language Argument puts an end to four centuries of angst about the problem of 'other minds'. I must confess to being one of the Three Wittgensteins party.

The book under review is mostly concerned with the issue between the Bakerians and Hackerites. As such it is already a tad out of date. However, Gordon Baker, to whom this collection is dedicated, was a skilled philosopher and a scholar of great distinction. The existence of this collection is a fitting tribute to him. Even though I think the focus of the most recent Wittgenstein studies has been the Third Wittgenstein question, the debate between the Bakerians and the Hackerites underlies just about everything one would want to say about the import of Wittgenstein's writings.

There are twelve substantial papers in this volume but I will pick out three for detailed comment, those that bear most directly on the very nature of Wittgenstein's project: the papers by Katherine Morris, Peter Hacker and Joachim Schulte. Morris's paper sets out the Bakerian position, while both Hacker and Schulte express critical attitudes to the 'therapy for the tortured suffers' interpretation.

Katherine Morris's chapter offers an enlightening but I think over-drawn comparison between the project that Wittgenstein took himself to be undertaking and the work of Merleau-Ponty -- prejudices serve as the source of perverse refusals to see clearly. The Wittgenstein of the Philosophical Investigations sees himself as 'getting rid of prejudices that interfere with a clear description of grammar' and also providing a description of grammar, not as a kind of windfall, but as an essential part of the project. She argues that he later moved to a pure 'anti-dogmatist stance' in which only the therapeutic task remained. Her argument picks up Baker's way of highlighting modal expressions -- the point being that one did not have to adopt a picture that seemed to be necessitated, other pictures are possible. Adopting any one of these will ease this incident of intellectual anguish -- but may in turn need another therapy session reminding the sufferer that there are yet other possible pictures. The author of the Investigations may have thought that adopting the expressive/descriptive grammar would be of permanent utility, but the 'anti-dogmatist' would reject this idea too. It is not clear to me where we are to find this new Wittgenstein. It is not the Third Wittgenstein of the recent interest in the role of hinges, sparked by careful readings of On Certainty and Part II of the Investigations.

By way of halting the slide among commentators toward the Bakerian position Peter Hacker systematically dismantles the grounds that Baker offered over the years for denying that Wittgenstein had an interest in philosophical arguments that would be of general significance. Some of Hacker's strictures turn on ways that Baker misunderstood and misinterpreted Frederick Waismann. Having known Waismann pretty well and having attended his classes during 1954-56 I can confirm from first hand how far Waismann was from the 'therapy only' position. More directly Hacker demolishes the claim that Wittgenstein was creating a kind of intellectualist parallel to Freudian psychotherapy. There simply is no evidence for it. Another and perhaps more significant point for those of us who teach Wittgenstein's philosophy to psychologists is Baker's extraordinary claim that Wittgenstein was not interested in displaying category mistakes of the kind Ryle identified in such a telling way. Of course Wittgenstein was! There can be no doubt that 'logical geography' was a large part of his technique. Baker came into the Oxford scene after the heyday of 'Oxford Philosophy' and somehow slipped into a familiar misunderstanding -- ordinary language was not the touchstone of philosophical clarity -- but it was the manifestation of conceptual systems that were actually put to work. Neither Austin nor Ryle, any more than Wittgenstein, had any pretensions to a 'theory of meaning'.

In using the Private Language Argument in the classroom the generality of Wittgenstein's remarks on the difference between expressive and descriptive relations between experience and language is quickly appreciated. This distinction is of general utility -- just as is the distinction between 'being guided' and 'being caused'. As Hacker insists (pp. 103-4) the source of philosophical errors and obsessions is 'our language' and not any particular user of it. This becomes very clear in On Certainty, when Moore's remarks about the material reality of his hands introduce a wide variety of hinges and their associated hinge propositions.

Joachim Schulte's criticisms are more fine grained and turn on misunderstandings of the nuances of some of the German expressions that carry a lot of weight in Wittgenstein's writings. Perhaps a bit unkindly, this chapter might be read as a cautionary tale about 'a little learning'. The three key expressions are 'bringing back', 'metaphysical' (in contrast to 'everyday'), and 'correct' or 'rightly'. In each case the German vocabulary rendered thus is complex, nuanced, and more a field of family resemblances than a sharply delineated vocabulary. Schulte shows how in crucial ways Baker latched on to one of the meanings, overlooking others that gave a very different flavor to the paragraph. One of the most interesting parts of Schulte's chapter is his remarks on the way context enters into understanding Wittgenstein. There are two contextual influences that make a huge difference. One is the other written material that was perhaps lying on the desk when Wittgenstein was writing or revising a paragraph; the other is whether the writings in question were composed in the course of a single day (vocabularies can be shown to change overnight as it were).

There are a number of other essays in the volume less sharply focused on the fundamental question raised by the dispute between Bakerians and Hackerites. Hans-Johann Glock, for example, manages to sit comfortably on the fence, though his work as an editor of the whole Wittgensteinian corpus might have given him an interesting overview. Alois Pichler distinguishes between text-immanent and context sensitive readings of Wittgenstein, and cross cuts this to the Bakerian/Hackerite distinction between pure therapy and therapy/philosophical argument. The meaning of 'metaphysical' is discussed by Hilary Putnam. Adrian Moore looks at the interpretation of Wittgenstein as a 'transcendental idealist' in early and in late works. In a characteristically elegant essay Marie McGinn discusses the way Wittgenstein uses 'simples' in the Tractatus, though, surprisingly she does not connect this with Hertz's 'simples'. Those of us who teach Wittgenstein courses find the 'beetle' hard going for our students -- David Stern does an excellent job in laying out the many ways this thought experiment has been understood. Ray Monk summarizes the development and reception or lack of it of Wittgenstein's philosophy of mathematics. Finally Alice Crary recruits Wittgenstein to a critical examination of ethical naturalism. Though these essays drift away from Gordon Baker's later take on Wittgenstein each is an enlightening contribution to one or another aspect of Wittgenstein's writings, early, middle and only to a limited extent, late.

The introductory chapter justifies the whole book in a way. It is an admirable survey of positions short of the advent of the Third Wittgenstein line. Of considerable interest is the section distinguishing style and method as either Externalist, where the style is more a reflection of Wittgenstein the man, or Internalist, where the style is more or less the method. Bakerians would be inclined to follow the latter line, while we Hackerites with our interest in the general utility of the method would be inclined to the former.