Wittgenstein and Naturalism

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Kevin M. Cahill and Thomas Raleigh (eds.), Wittgenstein and Naturalism, Routledge, 2018, 338pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138236868.

Reviewed by Jonathan Beale, Queen Anne's School


This collection fills a lacuna, as the first volume focusing on the relationship between Wittgenstein and naturalism. It addresses important topics in current philosophical debates and is philosophical rather than exegetical in focus. The essays cover a wide variety of themes and are pertinent both to Wittgenstein scholarship and current debates concerning naturalism. All chapters address connections between naturalism and the later Wittgenstein’s philosophy, with the exception of Charles Travis’, which also concerns the early Wittgenstein. (Accordingly, in what follows ‘Wittgenstein’ denotes the later Wittgenstein, unless otherwise specified.)

The fourteen chapters are divided into four parts. The question of whether Wittgenstein was a naturalist and if so of what kind is taken up in the first; these chapters also focus on the question of what naturalism is. The second addresses questions concerning the ‘naturalization’ of philosophical domains, such as consciousness, meaning, and mathematics. The third examines conceptual issues concerning the continuity between human and animal psychology. The final section addresses metaphilosophical themes concerning naturalism in the context of areas of contemporary philosophy, such as experimental philosophy and neo-pragmatism.

Interpreters of the later Wittgenstein as a naturalist often support their interpretation through reference to his remarks, in the first and second parts of the Investigations, on ‘the natural history [Naturgeschichte] of human beings’ (PI §§25, 415) and ‘general facts of nature’ (Naturtatsachen, PI §142; PPF §§365-6). These remarks are discussed in each essay in the first section (20; 42-3; 73). David Macarthur, for example (ch.2), connects these with meaning as use, writing that ‘Wittgenstein calls our attention to . . . the “natural history of the human”’ when he reminds ‘us of the ordinary use of words as they function in the everyday lives of human beings considered as natural beings in a natural world’ (42).

Some passages where Wittgenstein refers to ‘general facts of nature’ and our ‘natural history’ suggest that he holds that these are often ignored in philosophical investigations (e.g. PI §§142, §415). Some interpreters argue that these function as ‘naturalistic’ phenomena to which Wittgenstein directs our attention as part of his method of providing ‘surveyable representations’ (übersichtliche Darstellungen) of grammar. On this interpretation, Wittgenstein seeks to bring general facts about human nature into view as elements to which we should pay attention to elucidate certain concepts. These function as ‘observations’ (Feststellungen, PI §415) in the sense of serving as ‘reminders’ (PI §127) of the ways in which we use words and how far detached from these we can become when, for example, engaging in metaphysical theorizing. Daniel D. Hutto and Glenda Satne (ch.3) endorse this interpretation, arguing that Wittgenstein provides ‘philosophical reminders about facts of our natural history’ and ‘perspicuous representations of general facts of nature’ (73).

There are obvious reasons Wittgenstein cannot be considered a scientific naturalist; some of these are explained in the chapters by Macarthur (34-8) and Bjørn Torgrim Ramberg (318-9). Several interpreters have argued that Wittgenstein was a liberal naturalist; some of the contributors endorse this interpretation, such as Macarthur. Marie McGinn’s influential account of Wittgenstein as a liberal naturalist is appealed to extensively by Hutto and Satne and drawn upon by Macarthur and Ramberg (cf. McGinn 2013, 2010).

Hutto and Satne describe Wittgenstein not as a liberal naturalist, but as a ‘liberating naturalist’, in that he is concerned with liberating us from ‘certain mystifying tendencies of thought’, such as the tendency to engage in metaphysics (62-3). The naturalistic aspect emerges primarily from Wittgenstein’s emphasis on descriptions of phenomena in terms of how we describe them in everyday life (a play on ‘meaning as use’) (63), a point also discussed by Paul F. Snowdon (ch.1) and Macarthur (ch.2).

Hutto and Satne argue that we can construct a robust form of naturalism by combining Wittgenstein’s ‘liberating naturalism’ with what they call ‘relaxed naturalism’, which aims to ‘make clear how philosophy and various sciences . . . can take an interest in the same subject matter in a relaxed, complementary manner’ (62-3). Their ‘liberating, relaxed naturalism’ is thus a hybrid form of naturalism combining naturalistic aspects of Wittgenstein’s methodology with the natural, human and social sciences, as part of an interdisciplinary programme (cf. 73). This addresses the question of how Wittgenstein’s naturalism, if understood as part of his philosophical method, can be used to develop a more holistic naturalism.

Wittgenstein is described as a naturalist in other ways and connected with other forms of naturalism in this volume. Eugen Fischer (ch.12), considering the application of Wittgensteinian ideas to experimental philosophy, argues that ‘“meta-philosophical naturalism”. . . is consistent with broadly Wittgensteinian aims and strictures’. This is a ‘new kind of methodological naturalism’ promoted by experimental philosophy. Metaphilosophical naturalism ‘facilitates research that can provide empirical foundations precisely for the “therapeutic” aspects of Wittgenstein’s conception of philosophy that might seem antithetical to methodological naturalism’. Fischer appeals to recent psycholinguistic research which ‘can vindicate Wittgensteinian ideas about how an “urge to misunderstand” engenders merely apparent problems . . . which call for a therapeutic approach’, such as the problem of perception (260-1).

Snowdon argues that Wittgenstein is committed to ‘naturalismR’: the theory that the truths of some domain are grounded in or constituted by some ‘natural range specified in a general way’ (16). This is less demanding than forms of naturalism that hold that there need to be ‘natural grounds for the facts being analyzed’ or ‘equivalents in the “natural” vocabulary to sentences in the language of the domain’ with which we are concerned (16). Alongside ‘naturalismR’ we have ‘reductionR’ — the process of ‘naturalization’ corresponding to naturalismR. Meaning as use is a ‘reductiveR proposal’, in that Wittgenstein holds that we can locate ‘the phenomena which constitute . . . meaning and understanding’ within the ‘natural’ world of human activities (20). Snowdon argues that Wittgenstein thereby offers a ‘naturalistic . . . theory, of language’ (21).

Snowdon thus has no reservations with claiming that, controversially, Wittgenstein engages in theory construction. This affords a response to an objection facing the ascription of naturalism to Wittgenstein: naturalism can be construed as a theory and Wittgenstein is opposed to philosophical theory construction. Snowdon responds by arguing that Wittgenstein does put forward theories. Macarthur’s essay, which focuses on the relation between Wittgenstein’s naturalism and his anti-theoretical philosophical method, addresses this tension by arguing that the liberal naturalism he attributes to Wittgenstein is not doctrinal (33-4).

Several chapters argue that Wittgenstein’s opposition to metaphysics counts as an element of his naturalism. This is most directly addressed by Macarthur. Macarthur argues that the aim of Wittgenstein’s ‘non-explanatory liberal naturalism’ is to help us overcome ‘our tendency to metaphysicalize’ (45-6), a tendency he connects with Wittgenstein’s views on human nature. Macarthur interprets Wittgenstein’s aim of ‘bring[ing] back words from their metaphysical to their everyday use’ as ‘bringing ourselves back from unnaturalness to naturalness’ (43). This is inspired by Stanley Cavell’s account of Wittgenstein’s naturalism. Cavell reads Wittgenstein’s diagnosis of the human tendency to fall into metaphysical confusion as an aspect of Wittgenstein’s account of human nature: ‘we might . . . wish to say that what is natural to the human is precisely the unnatural’ (Cavell 2004, 276-7; cf. 43).

Two of the reasons Macarthur gives for holding that Wittgenstein was a liberal naturalist are questionable; these are worth noting since it has become quite common to describe Wittgenstein as a liberal naturalist. On Macarthur’s definition of liberal naturalism, the position involves a commitment to (i) rejecting supernaturalism and (ii) taking the sciences seriously (see, for example, De Caro and Macarthur in Putnam 2012, 16-17). It isn’t however clear that Wittgenstein endorses either. Concerning (i), in Wittgenstein’s conception of religious belief, he doesn’t outright deny the supernatural nature of notions such as God, nor the idea that Christ was a supernatural being, nor the idea that Christian notions such as a ‘Last Judgement’ have a metaphysical component.1 Concerning (ii), there are remarks, for example in Culture and Value, suggesting that Wittgenstein was hostile towards science (e.g. CV 5, 49, 56). William Child has recently provided a clear overview of these (2017, 84-6).

Interesting observations are made about the history of naturalism (Ramberg, 318), the connection between Wittgenstein’s views and the naturalistic views of other philosophers, such as Hume (Smith, ch.11) and Frege (Travis, ch.6), and the role of naturalism in the changes Wittgenstein’s thought underwent (Travis). Travis’ chapter offers a fascinating, detailed analysis of the shift in Wittgenstein’s thought from early to late in terms of a movement back towards the Fregean idea that the representational contents of thought cannot be reduced to particulars. In this way, Wittgenstein became opposed to naturalism, pace his earlier self, where ‘naturalism’ entails what is necessary to give an objective account of representational content: it needs to be accounted for in terms of particular, concrete elements of reality. Travis argues that Wittgenstein came to see that ‘naturalism is not the price of objectivity’ (149).

Wittgenstein’s hostility towards scientism affords another way to distinguish his naturalistic position from scientific naturalism, since scientific naturalism is often accused of being scientistic and Wittgenstein was vehemently opposed to scientism. Benedict Smith’s essay addresses this theme most directly, via a comparative account of Hume’s naturalism with Wittgenstein’s. Again, here Wittgenstein is described as a liberal naturalist.

Smith identifies surprising affinities between Hume’s naturalism and Wittgenstein’s — surprising because Hume’s naturalism is often identified as a precursor to scientistic forms of scientific naturalism. Smith argues that this identification is a mistake. According to Smith, Hume’s naturalism is ‘non-reductionist and . . . descriptive, in a Wittgensteinian sense’ (252). Hume’s and Wittgenstein’s philosophical programmes share a naturalistic strand in their concern with emphasising the importance of attention to the ordinary course of our lives in philosophical investigations (244). According to Smith, ’Wittgenstein’s non-reductive naturalism, just as Hume’s, conceives our subject matter as irreducibly situated in socially articulated practical contexts and risks irreparable distortion if detached from them’ (249). Their naturalistic approaches are non-reductionist and non-scientistic (252).

Wittgenstein’s relevance to contemporary philosophical debates concerning naturalism is considered in several chapters, such as in the context of experimental philosophy (Fischer), anti-representationalism and naturalism (Knowles), and pragmatic naturalism (Ramberg).

Jonathan Knowles (ch.13) discusses anti-representationalism and what he describes as the anti-metaphysical views of Huw Price and Paul Horwich concerning deflationism about truth and pragmatism about mind and language. Knowles’ aim is ‘to understand how anti-representationalism, anti-metaphysicalism, and naturalism might interrelate’ (288). He compares and critically assesses what Price’s and Horwich’s views concerning anti-representationalism, anti-metaphysicalism, and naturalism amount to and puts forward his understanding of how their ideas fit together. The relation with Wittgenstein is that ‘both see their views as having important resonance . . . with central themes of the later Wittgenstein’ (288).

Ramberg’s wonderfully titled, ‘Do Pragmatic Naturalists Have Souls? Should Anyone Be Paid to Worry About It?’ (ch.14), considers the approach taken towards the nature and value of philosophy by pragmatic naturalists. Ramberg identifies Wittgenstein as a philosopher pertinent to the issues he discusses, given the ‘integral connection in Wittgenstein’s philosophical practice between a conception of how to do philosophy and a view of what its aims and commitments may be’ (318). Wittgenstein’s role also lies in his influence upon the thinkers and the position considered — ‘philosophy critical pragmatic naturalism’: pragmatic naturalism engaged in metaphilosophical critique, endorsed by Richard Rorty, Huw Price, and Philip Kitcher (310-11).

Several essays illustrate ways that Wittgenstein’s treatment of certain concepts is naturalistic. Annalisa Coliva (ch.5), for example, explores Wittgenstein’s remarks on self-knowledge and argues that Wittgenstein’s treatment of self-knowledge is ‘hospitable’ to liberal naturalism (117). The connection emerges in two ways. First, Wittgenstein’s emphasis in his remarks on self-knowledge on ‘the role of instinctive and natural manifestations of our own mental states’, which are ‘necessary . . . to acquire the relevant psychological concepts and thereby get in a position to give new expression to our mental states through language’ (96). Second, Coliva argues that Wittgenstein held that ‘verbal manifestations’ of our mental states ‘would become “second nature” to us’ (96). This connection with ‘second nature’ may illustrate a point of convergence between Wittgenstein’s views and McDowellian liberal naturalism. Contrastingly, Hutto and Satne outline McGinn’s arguments that McDowellian liberal naturalism is fundamentally inconsistent with Wittgenstein’s views (65-70). Coliva writes that Wittgenstein ought to be regarded as the father of contemporary pluralism regarding self-knowledge, in that he held that we can express beliefs about our mental states ‘through a variety of epistemic methods’ (98).

William Child (ch.4) addresses questions concerning our concepts of conscious states, considering Wittgenstein’s views on sensation language expressed, primarily, in his so-called ‘private language argument’. Child considers Wittgenstein’s view and the view to which he is opposed — that there are natural properties to which we must appeal when giving an account of sensation concepts.

Child offers an interesting diagnosis of the trajectory each view inevitably follows: if we endorse a Wittgensteinian view, we are led to postulating the existence of natural properties. If we endorse an anti-Wittgensteinian view, we are led to appealing to the ways sensation concepts function in our practices. Each position thus inevitably leads to some form of the other. Given this quandary, a cogent account of our conscious mental states must exist within a ‘middle ground . . . that gives a role to our classificatory practices and to a notion of sameness or naturalness that extends beyond our limited capacities to recognise similarity or sameness of property’ (94-5). We must adopt such a ground in response to the question of the nature of our concepts of conscious states; we find such a ground in Wittgenstein’s philosophy (85). Child thus adumbrates, via Wittgenstein, the logical space for what he claims is the correct view about our conscious mental states.

One of Wittgenstein’s principal concerns in his philosophy of mathematics was the question of what makes mathematical propositions necessary. Sorin Bangu (ch.7) offers an ‘interpretative reconstruction’ of Wittgenstein’s views on mathematical necessity (152) and his own answer to this question. Bangu supports a controversial view attributed to Wittgenstein, that mathematical propositions are normative rules that become ‘hardened’ over time, through repeated empirical confirmations, into (what we regard as) necessary propositions. On this view, we need to understand ‘necessity as normativity’ (154). The sense in which Bangu’s account is naturalistic seems to be that it accounts for the emergence of necessity in empirical terms.

The chapters by Dorit Bar-On (ch.8) and Stina Bäckström (ch.10) consider the question concerning continuity between human and non-human animal minds. Bar-On argues against ‘continuity scepticism’: the claim that an ‘unbridgeable gap’ separates human from animal minds (177). Bar-On argues that the continuity sceptic ends up in a position of ‘Mind-mind dualism’, where animals are said to possess minds, but of a totally different ‘species’ to human minds, given the limitations the continuity sceptic places upon animal minds (197). Bar-On argues against the view that we require language for there to be mind-mind continuity between human and animal minds (182-3). She argues that ‘animal expressive interactions exhibit features that foreshadow significant aspects of human linguistic communication’ (189).

Bäckström’s paper argues against the continuity view, defended by Bar-On, on the basis that the human experience of temporality is far richer than that of non-human animals. Bäckström argues that linguistic capacities give humans a wider experience of temporality. She draws upon Wittgenstein’s writings for support (e.g. PI §§226, 647-8). In PI §650, for example, Wittgenstein writes: ‘a dog is afraid his master will beat him; but not, he is afraid his master will beat him tomorrow’. ‘The latter sort’, Bäckström writes, is ‘a human phenomenon’ (226). It ‘is hard to find a clear application for the question: Is the dog afraid it will get beaten now or in two days when its master comes home?’, since we lack criteria for application based on the dog’s expressions (227). This illustrates the general approach of Bäckström’s essay, addressing the question of how we conceive of the relation between the minds of humans and animals by considering the nature of expression (223).

Julia Tanney explores the application of mental concepts to animals (primarily, dogs). She argues that ascribing mental properties to domestic animals does not depend on inner, hidden, mental causes of overt behaviour. Tanney writes that we ‘would not be able to describe our lives with’ domestic animals ‘unless we were allowed to make use of . . . mental predicates’ such as intending, wanting, knowing, seeing, and believing (209). Tanney’s argument appeals to family resemblance, arguing that ‘there is a family of structures, more or less related, that can be discerned in the use of our natural language expressions’, rather than one particular thing in common shared by all mental predicates (209).

Kevin M. Cahill’s and Thomas Raleigh’s introduction offers a useful summary of the role of naturalism throughout Wittgenstein’s philosophy and a thorough synopsis of all the chapters, connecting them with the theme of each of the four parts of the volume. They offer a convincing account of why Wittgenstein is generally absent from contemporary philosophical debates even though his ideas seem well-placed to offer fruitful contributions.

The authors make a controversial claim in their introduction concerning Wittgenstein’s conception of philosophy: ‘Wittgenstein saw philosophy as either metaphysics or critique of metaphysics’ (10). Of all the areas of philosophy Wittgenstein was hostile towards, metaphysics was his primary target, because of its capacity to generate philosophical confusions, primarily of the kind brought about by blurring the distinction between philosophy, as he conceived of it, and science. In the Blue Book, for example, Wittgenstein writes:

Philosophers . . . are irresistibly tempted to ask and answer questions in the way science does. This tendency is the real source of metaphysics . . . (BB 18)

This dichotomous description of Wittgenstein’s conception of philosophy is, however, misleading since there are sources of philosophical confusion that do not emerge from metaphysics. Exposing misleading pictures at the root of philosophical confusion, for example, need not always be a matter of critiquing metaphysics.


Cavell, Stanley, 2004. ‘Postscript (2002) to ’The Investigations’ Everyday Aesthetics of Itself’’ in Mario De Caro and David Macarthur (eds.), Naturalism in Question (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2004, 275-9).

Child, William, 2017. ‘Wittgenstein, Scientism, and Anti-scientism in the Philosophy of Mind’ in Jonathan Beale and Ian James Kidd (eds.), Wittgenstein and Scientism (London: Routledge, 2017).

McGinn, Marie, 2013. ‘Liberal Naturalism: Wittgenstein and McDowell’, in Matthew C. Haug (ed.), Philosophical Methodology: The Armchair or the Laboratory? (New York: Routledge, 2013).

McGinn, Marie, 2010. ‘Wittgenstein and Naturalism’ in Mario De Caro and David Macarthur (eds.), Naturalism and Normativity (New York: Columbia University Press, 2010).

Putnam, Hilary, 2012. Philosophy in an Age of Science: Physics, Mathematics, and Skepticism (ed. Mario De Caro and David Macarthur). Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 2009 [1953]. Philosophical Investigations [Philosophische Untersuchungen] (tr. G.E.M. Anscombe, P.M.S. Hacker and Joachim Schulte). West Sussex: Wiley-Blackwell. (Cited as ‘PI’; ‘Part Two’ cited as ‘PPF’, to denote Hacker and Schulte’s way of referring to Part Two as Philosophy of Psychology: A Fragment.)

Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1998 [1977]. Culture and Value [Vermischte Bemerkungen] (Revised Ed.) (ed. G.H. von Wright and Heikki Nyman; Revised Ed. by Alois Pichler; tr. Peter Winch). Oxford: Blackwell. (Cited as ‘CV’.)

Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1972 [1958]. The Blue and Brown Books: Preliminary Studies for the Philosophical Investigations (Second Ed.). Oxford: Basil Blackwell. (Cited as ‘BB’.)

1 I’m grateful to Severin Schroeder for drawing my attention to this point.