Wittgenstein and Perception

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Michael Campbell and Michael O'Sullivan (eds.), Wittgenstein and Perception, Routledge, 2015, 183pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138829374.


Reviewed by Avner Baz, Tufts University


This volume contains eight papers, each focused on one aspect or another of Wittgenstein's work -- early or late -- that bears on perception. It also contains an overview by the editors of the various ways in which issues about perception come up in Wittgenstein's work, early and late.

One may reasonably become skeptical about the value of volumes of this sort. Not only does the quality of the contributions tend to be uneven, but also, however good the papers might be, it is unlikely -- given the broad range of topics discussed and how little time we each have to do our work -- that one would find all of the papers in such a volume, or really more than just a few of them, interesting and worth one's time. I myself, for example, would probably have chosen to read only two or three of the contributions to this volume if I hadn't committed myself to writing this review. I raise this worry not as an outsider but as a contributor to similar volumes.

Having said that, I think this is a good volume. The individual papers are, for the most part, clearly and carefully argued. They raise interesting questions both about perception and about Wittgenstein's thoughts about perception, and they usefully speak to each other in both obvious and unobvious ways. I will briefly discuss the individual papers, point out some of the ways in which they speak to each other, and raise a few issues that have come up for me in the course of reading them. I will say significantly more about some of the papers than about others, but this is mostly just an indication of my own philosophical interests.

The editors' overview is substantive and broad, and it offers some original and insightful observations. It usefully emphasizes, for one, that whereas in the Tractatus Wittgenstein places the subject -- as the object of philosophical (as contrasted with empirical) thought -- outside the world, proposes to understand perception in terms of judgment, and thinks of judgment, in turn, not as a worldly-situated and intersubjectively significant act but rather in terms of its propositional, objective content, the later Wittgenstein came to recognize the embodied and situated nature of perception and the difference between how we perceive things and what we judge or take ourselves to know about them. Elements of this evolution in Wittgenstein's thinking about perception are elaborated in Michael O'Sullivan's contribution to the volume.

I should say -- and here I part ways with most of my Wittgensteinian friends -- that for all of the later Wittgenstein's assimilation of the insights of phenomenology and Gestalt psychology, there are important lacunas in his thinking about perception that are due in part to his failure to break sufficiently with traditional categories and in part to limitations of his method of 'grammatical' inquiry. Let me give one small but, I believe, telling example from the present volume. Michel ter Hark offers an illuminating account of the development of Wittgenstein's understanding of what he later came to call 'aspect perception' or 'seeing something as something'. In the course of his account, ter Hark quotes a remark of Wittgenstein's in which he expresses disagreement with Köhler's idea that when figure and background switch for us as we look at the 'double- cross', lines that we previously saw as 'belonging together' are no longer seen as 'belonging together' and vice versa. Wittgenstein protests that Köhler's account is misleading because 'the radii that belonged together before belong together now as well; only one time they bound an 'arm', another time an intervening space' (Wittgenstein 1980, 1117; quoted by ter Hark on p. 178). But, as Merleau-Ponty notes in the Phenomenology of Perception (1996, 4) and as empirical studies have shown (see Block 2010), we actually do perceive the outline of the figure we focus on as belonging to the figure and not to its background (or intervening space), whose shape is perceived as indeterminate, and this despite the fact -- of which Köhler was well aware! -- that when we consider the matter objectively, the outline of the figure is equally the outline of its background. Köhler was not forgetting or ignoring the objective perspective. He was challenging the tendency, to which Wittgenstein has here succumbed, to take it as the starting point when attempting to describe, and understand, the world as perceived.

Another Wittgensteinian idea that the editors emphasize and that I found especially thought-provoking is that the relation between perceptual experience and its linguistic expression need not be thought of, and perhaps should not primarily be thought of, as one in which the former justifies or otherwise grounds the latter. I think this is a promising line of thought that could be taken even further. It may be that our perceptual experience and our expressive, embodied responses (linguistic and non-linguistic) to that experience are not separable in the way the tradition has tended to suppose. This may be true even when it comes to those linguistic responses that may aptly be thought of as expressive of judgments. This is what I understand Wittgenstein to be getting at when he says that the ground -- both of our practices and, hence, of philosophy -- 'is not certain propositions striking us immediately as true', but 'our acting, which lies at the bottom of the language-game' (Wittgenstein, 1969, 204; quoted by the editors on p. 24).

Now, the idea that perceptual experience ought to be such that it could rationally justify our propositionally expressible attitudes has been a prime motivation for various 'representationalist' accounts of perception, such as the one presented in John McDowell's Mind and World. Charles Travis (2013) has argued -- on the basis of an interpretation of moments in Frege, Wittgenstein, and Austin -- against representationalist accounts of perception as well as against accounts that have us normally perceive anything other than elements of 'our environment'. The two sorts of accounts against which Travis has argued tend to go together, when 'inner' mediators are posited which are supposed to be 'what we really perceive' and to represent our environment truly or falsely. Inversely, if our perceptual experience did somehow provide us with representations (true or false), it would thereby provide us with mediators that stand between us and whatever they represent. But representations, Travis has argued, are generalities -- decomposable into concepts that are themselves, essentially, general, whereas perception provides us not with generalities but rather with unmediated instances of generalities. It is then we who may represent what perception presents us with as being this or that way -- subsume it under this or that generality.

Daniel D. Hutto's paper develops a line of argument congenial to Travis'. He argues against the philosophical invocation of the notion of 'the content of (a) perceptual experience', where 'content' is typically understood to mean 'representational content'. In attempting to specify what is perceived, Hutto argues, the philosopher (or visual scientist) basically has two options: he could either take what is perceived to be objects, events, situations, and so on, in the objective environment, in which case he would be failing to refer to anything aptly called 'the content of perception', let alone 'the representational content of perception', or else he could take the content of perceptual experience to be the content of the (true or truthful) descriptions we may give of what we perceive, in which case he would lose his entitlement to talking about the content of perceptual experience, for there are indefinitely many different descriptions (and kinds of descriptions) we may give of what we perceive at any given moment (67).

Against 'anti-representationalist' accounts of perception such as Travis', Tyler Burge (2010) has argued that much of the work done in visual science relies on, and vindicates, the idea that perceptual experience has representational content. In response, Hutto argues, and cites a good number of philosophers and visual scientists who have also argued, that it does not follow from the fact that visual scientists have made progress in understanding how the visual system works and have used the term 'representation(s)' (or 'representational content') in articulating their understanding that the term, as they use it, actually refers to anything aptly, and non-misleadingly, called 'representation(s)'.

Marie McGinn (alas, the volume's sole woman contributor) argues that while Travis' account of perception is apt when it comes to one common and primary use, hence sense, of 'see', there are other uses of 'see' for which his account is inadequate. Following Elizabeth Anscombe, McGinn says that 'seeing' in those other uses/senses is 'intentional' or 'merely intentional'. I find Anscombe's and McGinn's (and equally Travis' and the Editors') use of 'intentional' in this context unclear and potentially misleading and will therefore not be using that term myself. The important point is that, according to McGinn, in those other uses/senses of 'see', what we are said to see is not an element of our objective environment. Following Wittgenstein, McGinn says that the criterion for what we see in these sorts of cases is the truthfulness (rather than truth) of our description of what we see. McGinn brings different examples of such 'merely intentional' uses of 'see' from Anscombe and from Wittgenstein. The example from Wittgenstein is the seeing of what he calls 'aspects'. For lack of space and since the examples from Anscombe are both esoteric and taken by both McGinn and Travis to be esoteric, I will focus just on the case of the seeing of Wittgensteinian aspects. For I think it poses a more serious problem for Travis' account of perception than even McGinn appreciates. (I use the somewhat cumbersome 'Wittgensteinian aspect(s)' because there is a tendency in the literature to conflate what Wittgenstein is investigating in his remarks on aspects with other sorts of things that may be called 'aspects'.)

In response to McGinn, Travis argues that the Wittgensteinian aspect -- say, the Necker cube seen as thus oriented (Travis names that aspect 'the A-cube') or the similarity that may strike us of one face to another -- is part of the environment, is 'there to be seen'. More specifically, Travis identifies the aspect with an objective 'look'. And the look is a generality, which is instanced by the Necker-cube or by the face but may also be instanced by indefinitely many other things (55). The 'A-cube' look may presumably be instanced, for example, by non-ambiguous cubes, whether drawn or three-dimensional, and, similarly, indefinitely many other faces may also bear visible similarity to the face whose similarity to another has struck us.

Travis' proposed understanding of Wittgensteinian aspects is actually anticipated by McGinn (40-1). She notes, in faithfulness to Wittgenstein, that the aspect, unlike an objectively establishable look, is 'not a property' of the thing (Wittgenstein 2009, Part II, 247). If, for example, I am struck by the similarity of one face to another -- in the sort of momentary experience Wittgenstein is focusing on -- nothing could prove me wrong, and when I give voice to the dawning of such an aspect, I am not giving others 'information about the external world' (Wittgenstein 1980, 899). Of course, there could be an objectively establishable (visible) similarity between two faces, but it would not be what Wittgenstein calls 'aspect' and seeks to elucidate in his remarks. Even the person Wittgenstein calls 'aspect-blind' would be capable of seeing the similarity between two faces thus understood (see Wittgenstein 2009, Part II, 257), .

At the same time, and as McGinn herself has insisted in previous work (1997), the Wittgensteinian aspect is not 'inner' or metaphysically 'private'. It is not (what Travis tends to call) a Fregean Vorstellung. Nor does it otherwise mediate between us and worldly objects (37). So when Travis insists that the aspect is 'there to be seen' (cf. 53), he is not mistaken. It's just that everything depends on what might plausibly be meant here by 'there to be seen'. The aspect is there to be seen, but neither in the sense that Travis' favorite peccaries are there to be seen, nor in the sense that their objective properties are there to be seen. Unlike peccaries and their objective properties, the presence or absence of the aspect cannot be established objectively. Moreover, unlike a Fregean generality, the Wittgensteinian aspect is not separable from our experience of seeing the thing in the way that the generalities Travis talks about elsewhere in his work on perception essentially are. This is why, when the similarity of one face to another dawns on me, and the face itself comes to look differently, and I give voice to that experience, I am not giving the other a piece of information about the external, objective world. Rather, as ter Hark notes (179), I am inviting her to share the experience or to see if she can. This, as ter Hark points out (177), is what Wittgenstein meant to bring out, in the Brown Book, in referring to our description of the aspect as 'intransitive' (I elaborate on this feature of Wittgensteinian aspects in Baz 2011).

Travis quotes approvingly Wittgenstein's saying that in the case of aspect perception we need to abandon the traditional categories of 'seeing' and 'thinking' (52), but then, rather than actually abandoning or rethinking those traditional categories, he goes on to propose that in the case of aspect perception, seeing and thinking -- as understood elsewhere in his work on perception -- somehow mix together, so that rather than merely recognizing the look which is objectively there to be seen, we also 'drink it in, study it, draw it, fantasize over it, and so on' (57). This last list is quite a mixed bag if you think about it, and this, I think, is an indication of the difficulty of accounting for the seeing of Wittgensteinian aspects while holding on to the Fregean dichotomy between seeing and thinking -- a dichotomy, I should say, that has served Travis well in his argument against representationalist views of perception such as McDowell's.

The question remains how much of a problem the seeing of aspects poses for Travis' Fregean account of perception. Travis (43, 46) and McGinn (38) are happy to agree that the seeing of Wittgensteinian aspects is a 'secondary' and relatively esoteric phenomenon, to be contrasted with normal seeing. Here I disagree with both. With Stephen Mulhall (1990, 2001), I believe that the dawning of Wittgensteinian aspects reveals something broader about normal human perception (though not quite what Mulhall has taken it to reveal). Roughly, it reveals the role we play in bringing about, and maintaining, the unity and sense of the world as perceived (not just as thought) (see Baz forthcoming). This is one of those places I talked about earlier in which Wittgenstein's remarks point us in the direction of, but do not take us all the way to, the phenomenological understanding of perception found, for example, in the work of Maurice Merleau-Ponty.

I said above that the Wittgensteinian aspect cannot be separated by means of description from our experience of the object seen 'under it'. To know what I see when I see a Wittgensteinian aspect, you'd have to see -- that, is, experience -- it yourself (this in contrast with objective properties). And if you're not familiar with the experience of being struck by a Wittgensteinian aspect, you cannot know what is here meant by 'aspect'. This makes the concept of a Wittgensteinian aspect what William Child, in his contribution,calls 'a phenomenal concept'. Child argues, convincingly to my mind, that there are phenomenal concepts in the above sense and that that is perfectly compatible with Wittgenstein's questioning of the idea of 'private language'. Indeed, if we broaden our understanding of 'experience', as I think we should, to include not merely particular sorts of sensations -- which is what Child focuses on -- but our experience of humanly significant situations in which words may naturally and intelligibly be used, then we may find that there is an important sense in which all of our concepts are phenomenal concepts. And we might then see why Austin describes his procedures as 'linguistic phenomenology' and why Wittgenstein says that to imagine a language is to imagine a form of life.

This leads me to Yasuhiro Arahata's thought-provoking contribution. Arahata begins by noting that McDowell's account of perception, in Mind and World and subsequent work, has failed at both the level of content and the level of method. At the level of content, McDowell has not succeeded in giving a theoretically satisfying and phenomenologically plausible account of how our objectively purported thinking connects with our perceptual experience (this, I believe, is something that Travis has shown more clearly and effectively than anyone else who has responded to McDowell). At the level of method, McDowell originally took himself to be offering Wittgensteinian therapy by way of the deliberate assemblage of truisms that no one could plausibly deny but ended up entangled in a rather traditional form of philosophical theorizing. Arahata proposes that Wittgenstein's remarks on aspect perception may show us how to think about perception and its relation to linguistic expression (and hence to thinking and judgment) in a way that would truly dissolve the sorts of traditional entanglements that McDowell has sought to dissolve. Insightfully, and in contrast with most other readers of Wittgenstein's remarks on aspects, Arahata likens the broad methodological move from McDowell to Wittgenstein to the move from Husserl to Heidegger, which he glosses in terms of 'dissolving the phenomenology of perceiving the world into that of living in the world' (100). The tendency among readers of Wittgenstein's remarks on aspects has been to focus on the rather artificial context in which someone looks at a midsize object (typically a schematic drawing) and -- apart from any significant situation and in isolation from the rest of her life and world -- sees it one way or another, typically while doing philosophy (or psychology). And this despite Wittgenstein's repeated invitations to remind ourselves of the normal, ordinary contexts -- the intersubjectively significant situations -- in which the concept of 'seeing (or noting) an aspect', as characterized by Wittgenstein, has its natural home. And I agree with Arahata's broader suggestion that if we took as our starting point the use of words to make moves and thereby position ourselves in intersubjectively significant worldly situations, then the traditional problematic McDowell has tried to put to rest -- concerning how our words, or our linguistically expressible attitudes, could relate to the perceived world in a rationally assessable way -- might truly lose its grip on us.

The one paper I have not yet mentioned is José Zalabardo's. It carefully details the young Wittgenstein's response to Russell's various attempts to offer a 'theory of judgment', or an 'analysis' of the sorts of 'facts' expressible by means of sentences of the form 'A judges (believes, thinks . . . ) that such and such', and Russell's consequent, failed attempts to amend his theory in light of Wittgenstein's objections. Zalabardo presents Russell as engaged in the kind of scholastic and idle metaphysical theorizing that the later Wittgenstein describes as the erection of Luftgebäude and that the young Wittgenstein was already attempting to extricate himself from in a way that Russell himself was unable to appreciate. Zalabardo succeeds, it seems to me, in doing justice to Russell's understanding -- that is, misunderstanding -- of Wittgenstein's response to his theory of judgment, but there are places in which he seems to succumb to that misunderstanding himself -- presenting Wittgenstein as accepting the terms and general approach of Russell's theorizing rather than as moving in the direction of a whole new way of understanding, and dissolving, the sorts of philosophical difficulties that exercised Russell.


Baz, A. (2011), 'Seeing Aspects and Philosophical Difficulty', in Handbook on the Philosophy of Wittgenstein, M. McGinn and O. Kuusela (eds.), New York: Oxford University Press.

Baz, A. (forthcoming), 'Aspects of Perception', in Wollheim, Wittgenstein, Seeing-as/in, and Art, G. Kemp and G. Mras (eds.), New York: Routledge.

Block, N. (2010), 'Attention and Mental Paint', Philosophical Issues 20: 23-63.

Burge, T. (2010), The Origins of Objectivity, New York: Oxford University Press.

McGinn, M. (1997). Wittgenstein and the Philosophical Investigations, London: Routledge.

Merleau-Ponty, M. (1996), Phenomenology of Perception, Smith, C. (tr.), New York: Routledge.

Mulhall, S. (1990). On Being in the World: Wittgenstein and Heidegger on Seeing Aspects. New York: Routledge.

Mulhall, S. (2001). 'Seeing Aspects'. In Wittgenstein: A Critical Reader. Glock, H. J. (ed.). Oxford: Blackwell.

Travis, C. (2013), Perception, New York: Oxford University Press.

Wittgenstein, L. (1969), On Certainty, G. E. M. Anscombe and G. H. von Wright (eds.), D. Paul and G. E. M. Anscombe (trans.), New York: Harper and Row.

Wittgenstein, L. (1980), Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, Volume 1, G. E. M. Anscombe and G. H. von Wright (eds.), G. E. M. Anscombe (tr.), Oxford: Basil Blackwell.

Wittgenstein, L. (2009), Philosophical Investigations, G. E. M. Anscombe, P. M. S. Hacker, and J. Schulte (tr.), Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.