Wittgenstein and Phenomenology

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Oskari Kuusela, Mihai Ometiță, and Timur Uçan (eds.), Wittgenstein and Phenomenology, Routledge, 2018, 280pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138648654.

Reviewed by  Charlotte Gauvry, FNRS/University of Liège


The purpose of this book is explicitly twofold. First, it seeks to investigate the relation between Wittgenstein and the historical phenomenological tradition. More precisely, it focuses on a number of figures designed as the "key-figures" of the phenomenological tradition: Husserl, Heidegger, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty and Levinas (with a special emphasis on Merleau-Ponty). Second, it intends to clarify what Wittgenstein meant by "phenomenology" during his own brief 1929-32 phenomenological period. The volume consequently includes one introduction and ten chapters whose focuses are Wittgenstein's own phenomenological period (chapter 1, 2 and 6), Wittgenstein and Husserl (chapter 3), Wittgenstein and Heidegger (chapter 4), Wittgenstein and Merleau-Ponty (chapters 5, 6, 7, 8), Wittgenstein and Sartre (chapter 9), Wittgenstein and Levinas (chapter 10). To my mind, both purposes are brilliantly achieved and the book indeed provides interesting analyses on the connexions between Wittgenstein and the main phenomenological figures. The discussion of what Wittgenstein meant by phenomenology is a particularly original and valuable contribution to the literature.

As outlined in the introduction, the comparison between Wittgenstein and the phenomenological tradition is not new. Already in the second half of the 20th century, numerous contributions have explored the connexion between the early or the late Wittgenstein and phenomenological figures. On that issue, the editors mention a selective list of comparisons that investigated the relation between Wittgenstein and Husserl (Dufrenne 1966, Ricœur 1967, Meixner 2014), Wittgenstein and Heidegger (Mulhall 1990 and 2001, Glendinning 1998, Romano 2008, Braver 2012, Egan et al 2013), Wittgenstein and Merleau-Ponty (Gier 1981, Romdenh-Romluc 2017), and Wittgenstein and Levinas (Plant 2005, Overgaard 2007). At first sight, the lacunar character of this presentation can be surprising. For instance, not a word is said about the comparisons between the two traditions in important German inaugural addresses (e.g., Apel 1973, Tugendhat 1976). Even more surprisingly, there is almost no reference to the rich and influential American reception of the phenomenological tradition and on its attempt to compare Husserl, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty and above all Heidegger's views with Wittgenstein's positions (see, e.g., Dreyfus 1990, Rorty 1991, Taylor 1985, Brandom 2002, Haugeland 2013, Crowell 2013 and so one).

In my view, this apparent limitation is indicative and manifests by contrast the main originality of this new volume: its special attention to the so-called "phenomenological" period of the "middle Wittgenstein". As manifested in his manuscripts, during a brief period (starting in 1929), Wittgenstein indeed considered the ideas of immediate experience, experiential concepts, phenomenological analysis and "phenomenological language" (see e.g., VW 313; RLF; MS 113; 123r; MS 152, 92). Nonetheless, even in his Remarks on Colour, Wittgenstein famously claimed: "There is no such thing as phenomenology, but there are indeed phenomenological problems" (RC§53/PS 176, 13r). The textual evidences are consequently rather ambiguous. In particular, it is difficult to determine the exact duration of this "phenomenological" period and its specific targets (see Kuusela and Ometiță's Introduction, 6-9). The substantial contribution of this volume consists precisely in its effort to clarify those exegetical questions. As a result, its general bibliography pays special attention to the literature focusing on this precise period. The editors mention for instance Spiegelberg 1968 and Gier/Reeder 1989-91 on Wittgenstein as phenomenologist, the Hintikkas 1986 "phenomenological" reading of Wittgenstein and the papers that were nurtured by the increasing diffusion of the Nachlass Manuscripts after 1990.

Most of the contributors are well-known Wittgensteinian scholars who have shown a recurrent interest in the historical phenomenological tradition. Additionally, I think that none of them would consider himself as a "phenomenologist". As a consequence, the volume is primarily addressed to people interested in Wittgenstein, who seek to improve their knowledge of a specific and less documented period of Wittgenstein's work: the "Middle Wittgenstein", or to phenomenologists who intend to deepen their understanding of Wittgenstein's positions. By contrast, it seems less relevant for investigating the traditional phenomenological figures themselves. An illustration: although clear and correct, the analysis devoted to the presentation of Husserl's phenomenology in the introduction is schematic compared to what is developed on Wittgenstein. Besides, almost nothing is said in order to introduce the other "key-figures".

The contributions are of high quality. Most of them are even excellent: very clearly written, relying on a precise knowledge of Wittgenstein's conceptions, providing rich and deep analyses and original inferences. Nevertheless, in a surprising way, three of them are less analytical and deliberately adopt a non-academic mode of exposition, basing their argumentation on a "vague hunch" (Morris), a personal tragedy (Read) or a piece of literature (Søndergaard). An hypothesis: those (although very different) contributions may be read as various attempts of practicing philosophy in a manner that some—notably Cora Diamond (who was the teacher Rupert Read)— claim is inspired by Wittgenstein's own non-academic style.

The contributions devoted to the analysis of the "middle Wittgenstein" (Engelmann, McManus, Ometiță) are of particular interest. They manifest a very erudite and thorough reading of the manuscripts of the Nachlass, the Philosophical Remarks and the Big Typescript. They consequently raise crucial historical questions related to the relation of Wittgenstein to the members of the Vienna Circle (in particular to Schlick) and to conceptual difficulties regarding phenomenal language, experiential concepts, colour-exclusion, the a priori, the arbitrariness of grammar problems, etc.

In addition, although they are not dominant for the reasons previously explained, the volume includes some very good discussions of Husserl (Dwyer), Heidegger (Kuusela), Merleau-Ponty (Baz, Ometita) and Sartre (in Narboux's very inspiring paper on the non-referential theories of self-consciousness in Wittgenstein and Sartre).

Against this background, Avner Baz's contribution on seeing aspects presents a polemical character inasmuch as he is the only contributor to defend a "phenomenologist" position (influenced by Merleau-Ponty) against Wittgenstein and some standard readers of Wittgenstein (he especially opposes Charles Travis). His contribution raises an essential question regarding the main topic of the volume: Do Wittgenstein's grammatical investigations accurately grasp the subjective dimension of our experiences? He answers no, focusing on the experience of seeing aspects: according to him, Wittgenstein's attention to the grammar of our ordinary language "is suitable for elucidating the concept of 'aspect (dawning)' and its place among our concepts of experience, but less suitable for elucidating the experience of aspect dawning and its relation to other features and dimensions of our perceptual experience" (131-132). I am personally not convinced by Baz's reasoning. I specifically think that Wittgenstein's contextualist method actually pays attention to the non-standard cases of perception. Besides, I believe that the analysis of psychological concepts indeed furnishes some indication of (inner) experience. Nevertheless, I consider that Baz's paper highlights one of the main phenomenological challenges that Wittgenstein's grammatical method has to face.

Despite the general quality of the volume and the intrinsic interest of each chapter, I would formulate two methodological regrets. The first regards the general conception of "phenomenology" conveyed. Phenomenology is presented as an established historical tradition instantiated by five dominant figures (Husserl, Heidegger . . .). Yet, such a presentation is incorrect, if not misleading. All the theses discussed by the main German or French phenomenologists obviously took place in a broader background structured by different schools of thought: Hermeneutics, Neo-Kantianism, the Brentano School, Gestalt Psychology (Baz fortunately mentions Köhler), etc. Consequently, the so-called "phenomenological tradition" is far from been a unified stream of thought and relies on various and heterogeneous practices. It would have been worth analysing further this complexity before introducing Wittgenstein's own heterodoxy. For instance, Wittgenstein manifestly referred to Ernst Mach' descriptive "phenomenology" in 1929 rather to Husserl (even if Husserl himself had read Mach) (see, e.g., Marion 1998).

Even more, it has recently been suggested (see, e.g., Mulligan 2012) that, from an historical point of view, it is more relevant to compare Wittgenstein's 1930 to Franz Brentano, Anton Marty (Brentano School), Karl Bühler (Würzburg school), Köhler (Gestalt Psychology) etc., rather than to the "key-figures of phenomenology". All those direct or indirect "phenomenologists" actually worked at the same period on topics similar to those that interested the "middle Wittgenstein": methodological problems (the role of description, etc.), psychological problems (colour-exclusion, seeing-aspects, etc.) and linguistic problems (rules and context, grammatical and essential rules, deixis, etc.).

Besides, from a more conceptual point of view, I would have expected that a volume entitled "Wittgenstein and phenomenology" would raise some questions regarding the intensive and extensive definition of "phenomenology". Is it a school of thought historically and geographically delimited (if so, how to include Wittgenstein)? Is it rather a descriptive method of analysis, a specific attention to the eidetic laws of experience or a consideration of its subjective quality? If the last assertion is correct, does it make sense to consider the prolific research in contemporary philosophy of mind on the phenomenality of consciousness (Nagel, Jackson, Searle, Kriegel, Siewert, etc.) as "phenomenology" (as is often the case)? Some answers to those questions are locally given in different chapters (Engelmann, McManus, Dwyer). However, I think that the volume would have benefited from a clear and updated rethinking of the concept of "phenomenology" and that it somehow makes its work too easy by considering phenomenology as a narrowly circumscribed tradition.

My second regret is somehow connected with this very last point regarding the recent philosophy mind. As explicitly mentioned, one of the purpose of the volume is to "clarify more broadly the relations between analytic and phenomenological philosophy" (see the back cover). Although this opposition made sense in the 1950's, and indeed Wittgenstein was sometimes used to serve such a distinction (see, e.g., Ryle 1949's uses of Wittgenstein insights against the "phenomenological" approach), one can wonder whether it still makes sense nowadays. As just mentioned, a signifying part of the contemporary philosophy of mind presents itself, if not as "phenomenological", as "phenomenal". In other words, recent developments have led to consider "phenomenology" as a lively part of the philosophy of mind. Consequently, I regret that none of the contributions reflect those contemporary debates and the place of Wittgenstein in the on-going discussions on consciousness (except Narboux's very interesting discussion on self-consciousness). Of course, I am however perfectly aware that this was not the purpose of the volume.

Despite those targeted limitations, I consider that this new book is of great interest and even that it is one of the best collections of papers published on this complex topic. It above all achieves the following objective: the investigation of Wittgenstein's own phenomenological period. That is the reason why I would especially recommend its reading to those who intend to investigate further Wittgenstein's complex Manuscripts from 1929-1932.


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