Wittgenstein and Reason

Placeholder book cover

John Preston (ed.), Wittgenstein and Reason, Blackwell, 2008, 149pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405180955.

Reviewed by Daniel D. Hutto, University of Hertfordshire


'Reason' is not one of Wittgenstein's usual words (this is pointed out by more than one of the contributors to Wittgenstein and Reason). Despite this, his insights into the nature of rule-following, the basis of religious belief and our capacity to understand and interpret both the mundane and ritualistic practices of others sheds important light on what we might possibly mean by talk of what is reasonable and rational. This is clearly brought out, in different ways and contexts, by the various contributors to this collection. Each chapter of the volume offers a tightly argued, beautifully written and illuminating take on these issues.

Jacques Bouveresse's contribution consists of a paper from 2000, re-printed and translated from French for the first time especially for this collection. It explores, in detail, Wittgenstein's critique of Frazer's approach to understanding ritual practices, such as those involving the famously sinister activity of human sacrifice, as practiced by the shores of Lake Nemi in ancient times. Special attention is given to Frazer's tendency to misconstrue the point of engaging in such practices by treating them as poorly conceived attempts to bring about certain results by causal means. If Frazer's view were correct, this would not only reflect a kind of basic human proto-scientific attitude to the world, but one that happened to have been very poorly grounded. Essentially, if this were the point of practice then we would be right to regard it as a sort of hopeless and superstitiously corrupt attempt at scientific control. But, Bouveresse observes, it was precisely this type of mischaracterization of our basic human activities and tendencies against which Wittgenstein chiefly wished most to guard. By way of contrast, he proposed that we can only begin to grasp the point or enter into the spirit of ritual practices, and thus make them intelligible, by first noting their expressive, symbolic character and seeing how these relate to our own tendencies for engaging in relevantly similar behaviour. Therefore, without denying the possibility or potential value of providing actual, accurate historical explanations of the genesis of specific rituals, the kind of understanding that Wittgenstein thought was required was of a wholly different sort. It is the kind of understanding that can only be engendered by our making comparisons with such practices and our own basic and everyday inclinations for non-instrumental, ritual activity (e.g. the shaking of hands, kissing foreheads). By seeing that there is a sort of formal connection between what we do and real and imagined examples of such activities, it is possible to recognize that 'This is simply the way human beings live, or act, or react'. This is a paradigm of a philosophical revelation.

Distinguishing conceptual relativism into its alethic and ontological forms, Hans-Johann Glock makes a sophisticated case for its possibility (but not its truth per se). He identifies the kind of conceptual relativism (CR) of interest (one that he finds in Wittgenstein, see p. 25) as the logical product of two claims: that concepts are not given to us by the world or experience in a fixed way and that there is, ultimately, no neutral framework for assessing the truth or rationality of adopting one set of concepts over another. His paper provides a compelling defense of the possibility of CR by de-stabilizing the core of Davidson's famous argument based on the impossibility of imagining a language (and hence conceptual scheme) that is, in principle, not susceptible to translation or interpretation. Many take that argument to have decisively dispatched the idea that there might be radically different conceptual schemes. Glock works to rescue the situation by laying bare the bones of Davidson's argument to reveal that it encounters a dilemma. One or other of its central premises has to go. Thus, on Glock's rendering, at one step the argument requires that we accept the possibility of alternative conceptual schemes and implies the possibility of untranslatable languages. But it is cogently shown that if the notion of 'untranslatability' indicates something very strong, such as inexplicability or ineffability, then we have no reason to accept this premise as true. And Glock goes on to argue that the weaker -- and much more plausible -- claim, which takes failure of translation to indicate something along the lines of, say, an isomorphism, is too weak to lend warrant to another of Davidson's key premises -- the idea that we could never recognize a practice as an untranslatable language. Either way, Glock concludes, the standard Davidsonian road to the conclusion that CR is unintelligible is not serviceable.

Jane Heal puts the notion of perfect rationality (PR) under the microscope and finds it wanting. She provides compelling arguments for thinking that its requirements are far too demanding to be realized, even in principle. Pivotally, she doubts that we can even make sense of there being a determinate set of a thinker's beliefs and desires from which to get started. She builds from this to show that the project of making explicit and assessing all of one's presuppositions, required for PR, is fundamentally misconceived however we might try to cash it out. Indeed, a major part of the problem is that "There is more in the intentional state of a person than can be captured by some list of linguistically expressible beliefs or desires" (p. 55). While recognizing the important uses that the construct of PR has had in philosophy, she challenges its ultimate intelligibility and warns of the dangers that stem from treating it as a regulative ideal that sets standards toward which we might aspire. For this risks privileging one kind of human practice -- that associated with a kind of idealized mathematical form of reasoning -- above all others. In place of this 'picture' she bids us to attend to the variety of features and activities that we class among the rational. Promoting a more modest, ecologically grounded notion of rationality, she gets us to focus on the requirements of being an impressive conversant (requirements that will vary in different contexts and cultures) to good effect.

Genia Schönbaumsfeld touches on a related theme but focuses on the specific case of what grounds religious language and beliefs. She argues that, according to Wittgenstein, one can only properly understand and assess religious beliefs from the inside, by becoming familiar with the relevant practices and coming to understand how its concepts and symbols function in their home context. In promoting this line, she objects to Nielsen's analysis which, she claims, falsely fosters the idea that we must choose between either taking religious language to be committed to certain metaphysical claims, which can be straightforwardly rendered, or treating it as merely expressive in an utterly deflationary sense -- i.e. as the meaningless outpourings of a specific kind of contentless, non-cognitive way of life. It is this kind of simple set of options that is precisely what a Wittgensteinian approach to understanding language precludes across the board. Thus "Wittgenstein isn't denying that people mean what they say when making religious utterances. Rather he is insisting that we cannot understand what meaning the utterances come down to unless we understand the use to which the religious 'pictures' are put" (p. 68). As such, there can be no tenable separation between belief and practice if we are to understand the point of religious language -- and in this respect such language is not a special case.

Schönbaumsfeld's paper is a salient reminder that any critique of religious believing must be handled in a sophisticated way (in line with the maxim that one cannot rationally criticize what one does not understand). Still, questions remain about how one can adopt truly a religious attitude and beliefs if the latter has implications that one knows to be improbable. Severin Schroeder explores how this question arises in a poignant way for Wittgenstein both philosophically and personally. The tension stems not from the fact that religious thinking is based in metaphysical beliefs that are hard to sustain, but rather from the fact that even if we accept that such thinking is grounded in a specific kind of attitude that we can both understand and respect, the beliefs that it gives rise to are simply too incredible for honest acceptance in the cold, rational light of day. Schroeder works carefully to show not only how Wittgenstein recognized this incompatibility but also the ways in which he was regularly tormented by it. In the end, he suggests that it remains unresolved in his philosophy of religion.

Joachim Schulte turns his hand to the task of illuminating the genealogy of the 'rule following considerations' in an attempt to recover something of value that is often missing from certain popular and overly sophisticated readings such as those inspired by, or which seek to respond to, Kripke's formulation. His analysis reveals the ways in which Wittgenstein's early attempts to distinguish rules and propositions, and to understand their intimate relation, acted as a spur for his later philosophical development. Emphasis is placed on the fact that Wittgenstein was not seeking to identify language use with the playing of games with fixed rules but, rather, his aim was to use more or less well-defined games and calculi as comparative models that shed light on aspects of language use. Schulte argues that a consequence of adopting this reading is that the rule-following considerations "do not, or need not, apply to normal ways of using language, since these considerations do concern a calculus, a game with clearly fixed rules" (p. 115). As a result, echoing Heal, to take this seriously one is pushed to recognize a much broader and less technical notion of what is reasonable operating in Wittgenstein's thought -- one that gets is ultimate articulation in On Certainty where -- by Schulte's lights -- a troubling, somewhat menacing and shifty relativism about what counts as 'reasonable' is promoted.

Crispin Wright rounds off the set with another entry on the rule-following considerations, but this one focuses on their connection with Wittgenstein's quietist approach to philosophy. After reminding the reader of the ontological and epistemological implications of taking seriously the standard picture of what rule-following demands, quite generally, Wright goes on to show why, for different but well known reasons, neither of the standard explanatory strategies (i.e. those sponsored by Platonists and communitarians) can live up to its promises. He accepts that Wittgenstein's finished view on the matter is that our systematic difficulty in understanding the requirements of rule-following is generated by a misplaced demand for explanations of a certain form. As a result philosophers systematically fall into the trap of trying to apply the wrong sort of overly-sophisticated model of what reasoning involves to what, in the basic cases of interest, is really only a competence through which we 'follow rules blindly or without reasons' (p. 140). The paper concludes not only by recognizing that this take on rule-following 'goes against the grain' but by illustrating this fact with a wonderful discussion of how it could only be successfully challenged by rehabilitating a notion of experience as 'essentially conceptually contentful', of the sort promoted by McDowell. Wright is keen only to stress that this is a forced move for "any philosopher determined to have it that basic judgements are made for reasons furnished by experience" (p. 143). He demurs from passing a verdict on whether such an account will ultimately pass muster.

The above digest is brief and only manages to convey a very crude sense of the aims, scope and content of the various contributions. While some questions can be raised here and there about the authors' analyses and claims, I found very little to criticize -- all of the papers are of a very high quality. As is often the case when reviewing edited volumes, it is difficult to do little more than point to some highlights. I urge the reader to seek out this small but extremely valuable collection to fully evaluate the nuanced lines of argument it offers.

The delivery of sharply argued, cohesive essays that emerge from conferences held at Reading is a hallmark of Blackwell's Ratio book series and this volume is no exception to that rule. The tight focus on varied but connected topics gives this short, crisp collection a strong thematic unity that enables the reader to find important threads linking its discussions despite the fact that individual chapters each has its own, quite distinct aims and identity. Still, readers will notice that support for the claims required by one contribution is often amplified by the fact that those claims (or close variants) are also required to be true in order to make the best sense of Wittgenstein's thinking in some other context. For example, the idea that beliefs can only be understood as integrally grounded in certain practices, activities and ways of life, as opposed to being somehow distinct from these, is a recurrent theme. At the same time, sometimes interesting and useful challenges are raised about the interpretations of other contributors (for example, there is an important disagreement between Glock and Schönbaumsfeld on how to read Davidson). Taken as a whole, this volume provides an extremely valuable and critically astute examination of utterly fundamental issues that need serious attention and investigation in today's philosophical climate -- it constitutes a 'must read'.