Wittgenstein and Scientism

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Jonathan Beale and Ian James Kidd (eds.), Wittgenstein and Scientism, Routledge, 2017, 231 pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138829398.

Reviewed by Anna Boncompagni, University of Florence


There is a risk in tackling a topic such as Wittgenstein and scientism. Since it is indisputable and well-known that Wittgenstein had a negative attitude towards the trespassing of science beyond its limits, the risk is that of being unoriginal and ultimately simplistic. This volume, despite some repetitiveness of themes and arguments, happily avoids facile or conventional conclusions. By bringing together essays written from different perspectives and focusing on different aspects of the issue, it offers a wide-ranging overview not only of its many facets, but also of its complex interrelation with the most profound threads of Wittgenstein's thought. If the aim of the book, as stated by the editors in the introduction, is to demonstrate that Wittgenstein's anti-scientism 'sheds light upon and reveals connections between some of the central areas of his thinking' (p. 5), and more generally that examining it 'helps to better understand some of the principal areas of his thought' (ibid.), then this has been entirely achieved.

The volume's introduction intentionally does not define scientism, preferring to consider it as a sort of family-resemblance concept (pp. 1-2), which is understandable in light of the variety of perspectives that the book comprises (though perhaps a brief historical contextualization might have been appropriate). Yet, three general points can be made before entering into the specific contents of the chapters.

First, scientism is not a mere 'derivation' from science (and anti-scientism is not a mere opposition to science); scientism is an attitude not of science but about science, and as such, it can be embodied or expressed by any individual, group, society, or culture, and not exclusively by scientists in their practices. This is perhaps trivial but relevant, for the criticism of scientism is too often conflated with the criticism of science itself, and this masks its broadly cultural nature. In other words, Wittgenstein can be right in criticizing the scientistic tendencies of the modern civilization, even if those tendencies have little place in the actual scientific practices of his time (see Ch. 5). Furthermore, and precisely for this reason, scientism can impair not only philosophy but also science itself (see Ch. 1).

Second, scientism has to do with an overconfidence in the power of science and the conviction that all there is, is knowable and explicable in scientific terms. Corollaries are: science has the right, if not the duty, to extend its dominion into any territory; the scientific method is 'the' method of inquiry par excellence; other disciplines, if they are to attain knowledge at all, ought to conform to the scientific method; any domain of human experience can and should be reduced to the natural, empirical domain of science. All this is connected to the broader issues of naturalism and empiricism, which are themselves far from univocal (see Ch. 12), and to the relationship between science and philosophy.

Third, scientism is not only overconfidence in science. It is usually, and certainly it was in Wittgenstein's perception, part of a whole world-view that emphasizes growth, progress, and construction, a world-view that, partly following Oswald Spengler, he clearly opposed (see Wittgenstein 1980, pp. 6-7). One of the main reasons for his aversion to the scientistic world-view was that it deprives human beings of 'wonder', which he considered to be a deep need and feature of human nature. As he stated in 1930, in a remark quoted by many of the contributors, 'Man has to awaken to wonder. . . . Science is a way of sending him to sleep again' (Wittgenstein 1980, p. 5; on wonder see also Cahill 2011).

These points are broadly present in all the essays, explicitly or implicitly. Although the volume is not divided into parts, the introduction helpfully groups the contributions as follows: chapters 1 to 4 deal with scientism as a theme in Wittgenstein's writings; chapters 5 to 8 attempt to 'apply' anti-scientism; and chapters 9 to 12 are more concerned with the link between this topic and understanding Wittgenstein overall. While I wonder why the editors did not make this partition explicit in the table of contents, I will follow this structural suggestion and present an overview of the chapters in three blocks, before adding some other considerations on the significance of the book in general.

The first group of contributions tackle Wittgenstein's anti-scientism more straightforwardly. Chon Tejedor's 'Scientism as a threat to science: Wittgenstein on self-subverting methodologies' is the only chapter that deals with the early Wittgenstein. Against the 'dominant reading' that views scientism as a threat of science against philosophy and other disciplines, Tejedor claims that scientism can be a threat also to science, in that it distorts its nature and scope, and it can become manifest also in other disciplines, most notably in metaphysics. In 'Superstition, science, and life', David E. Cooper aims at understanding the reasons behind Wittgenstein's defense of religious attitudes and practices against scientific naturalism. According to Cooper, Wittgenstein's 'life-world strategy', focusing on the concepts of form of life and Weltbild, is his most promising maneuver. The radical ungraspability of world-views prevents the possibility of an alleged privileged point of view of science: Wittgenstein's defense of religion is motivated by his aversion to the latter. Annalisa Coliva's 'Rituals, philosophy, science, and progress: Wittgenstein on Frazer' analyzes Wittgenstein's anti-scientism in his remarks on Frazer's Golden Bough (Wittgenstein 1993), the context in which it emerges with most clarity. The anthropological (and philosophical) method, in Wittgenstein's interpretation, differs from the scientific method in that it does not aim at explanation, but rather at description. Frazer's fundamental mistake is to try to explain rituals: in so doing, he actually precludes the possibility of understanding them. In 'Wittgenstein's anti-scientistic world-view', Jonathan Beale argues that anti-scientism is what intimately connects Wittgenstein's conception of philosophy and his aversion to the tendencies of his own time. In Beale's interpretation, Wittgenstein's anti-scientism not only is an opposition to the scientistic world-view: it is itself an alternative world-view, hinged on the method of surveyable representation.

The book's second (implicit) section contains contributions that tend to 'apply' Wittgensteinian anti-scientism in different domains. In 'Wittgenstein, scientism, and anti-scientism in the philosophy of mind', William Child observes that in this field Wittgenstein's anti-scientism takes two forms: first, it opposes the tendency to practice philosophy of mind as a kind of science (e.g. reducing mental phenomena to physiology); second, it opposes the tendency to treat common-sense psychology as a primitive form of science. Anti-scientism here means also doing justice to the uncertainty and 'imponderable evidence' of our judgments concerning others' feelings and emotions. 'Reawakening to wonder: Wittgenstein, Feyerabend and scientism', by Ian James Kidd, is an attempt to compare Wittgensteinian insights on scientism with those of Feyerabend. The enduring lesson that he learned from Wittgenstein, Kidd argues, is precisely an anti-scientistic attitude and a connected sense of wonder and mystery at human existence, itself rooted in an apprehension of the ineffability and groundlessness of the world-pictures with which we frame reality. In the following chapter, ''Too ridiculous for words': Wittgenstein on scientific aesthetics', Severin Schroeder tackles aesthetics and in particular the idea, outrageous to Wittgenstein's ears, that aesthetics could be considered a form of science. He notices that for a venerable philosophical tradition, counting Hume and Kant among its members, the objective of aesthetics was to set up a standard of taste; indeed, the possibility that empirical psychology could offer a scientific account of it still sounds plausible to many. Wittgenstein's insight is instead to focus on the cultural and historical anchorage of taste and aesthetics, which gives substance to our judgments. Rupert Read's 'How to think about the climate crisis via precautionary reasoning' is perhaps the clearest application. Read defends a precautionary approach to serious environmental threats by an appeal to anti-scientism. Since in the public sphere the lack of scientific evidence is often a motive for inaction, he claims that we should acknowledge from the outset that science is neither the only nor the best mode of inquiry. In the face of the environmental crisis, instead of waiting for scientific knowledge, we should just act on the basis of a precautionary principle, which in this context he sees as an alternative to scientism.

The third group of chapters connects scientism with the overall interpretation of Wittgenstein's thought, or some aspects of it. Danièle Moyal-Sharrock, in 'The myth of the quietist Wittgenstein', uses a reflection on anti-scientism as a means for contrasting the therapeutic interpretation of Wittgenstein. In her view, one of the problems with scientism is that it encourages people to think that scientific explanation is the only explanation there is, and therefore that a philosopher not involved in explanations is not proposing anything positive. Against the 'myth' of the quietist Wittgenstein, she further claims that in Wittgenstein's approach there is space not only for conceptual elucidation, but also for 'thin' theoretical positions and non-scientistic explanations. The focus of Genia Schönbaumsfeld's 'Meaning scepticism and scientism' is instead the debate on rule following. More specifically, she connects scientism with a naturalistic-sceptic interpretation of rule following à la Kripke, according to which it is only through an appeal to community that the gap between a rule and its application can be filled. This view, she claims, not only fails to see that Wittgenstein's point is precisely that there is no such gap; it also wrongly suggests that if we refuse Platonism on meaning, we must embrace a form of reductive naturalism. According to Schönbaumsfeld, Wittgenstein shows, conversely, that between these two extremes there is a viable 'middle ground' (cf. McDowell 2002).

In 'Wittgenstein, science, and the evolution of concepts', James C. Klagge proposes a reflection on how concepts evolve, claiming that Wittgenstein's position on this changes through time. In 1930 Wittgenstein affirmed (roughly) that the rules of use for a concept fix its meaning in such a way that a change in the rules entails a new concept, and not a conceptual change: this is substantially an endorsement of Frege's 'conceptual essentialism' (pp. 196, 201; on Frege and scientism/anti-scientism, see also Bengtsson, Säätelä and Pichler 2018). Yet Wittgenstein later came to think that real conceptual changes are possible, and can also be fostered by scientific discoveries. In this sense, Klagge concludes, the grammatical and the empirical -- the provinces of philosophy and science respectively -- are not so separate. The final essay, 'Wittgenstein, naturalism, and scientism' by Benedict Smith, defends the possibility of a form of naturalism compatible with anti-scientism, based on Wittgenstein's aim of describing 'the spatial and temporal phenomena of language' (Wittgenstein 2009, PI, § 108). Wittgenstein's point, for Smith, is that when justifications come to an end, the inclination to say 'This is simply what I do' (Wittgenstein 2009, PI, § 217), far from being a concession to scepticism, amounts to acknowledging that our most basic actions are normative from the outset. Here a kind of naturalism coexists with an anti-scientistic outlook.

One of the leitmotifs that underlies most discussions regarding scientism and anti-scientism in Wittgenstein, is the relationship between logic or grammar on the one side, and experience on the other. This relationship assumes various forms and reappears in other distinctions, not completely overlapping with one another, such as those between grammatical and empirical propositions, normativity and factuality, and philosophy and science. A crude way of characterizing Wittgenstein's position in this respect is to say that in his view philosophy deals with logic or grammar, science deals with experience, scientism is the result of science's invasion of the terrain of philosophy, and anti-scientism is the legitimate defense of this terrain. With the caveat already highlighted -- that is, keeping in mind that scientism is actually not a fault of science or scientists, but rather a misleading picture embodied in a widespread idea of science -- this characterization, crude as it may be, does capture Wittgenstein's position in its general terms. However, it does not capture its most interesting facets, nor does it help to understand why Wittgenstein insisted so much on the difficulty of drawing these distinctions. In order to see the significance of this issue in Wittgenstein's philosophy, we need to look at his many attempts (early and late) to account for what happens at the very edge between the two domains of grammar and experience. One of the merits of this collection is that it helps to focus on this aspect, which emerges in its most challenging chapters.

It would be a mistake to think that the problematic nature of the relationship between logic/grammar and experience is only a theme for the later Wittgenstein; although it probably assumes a broader importance later, the Tractatus also bears signs of such a reflection. Chapter 1, for instance, draws attention to those very special propositions that are in a sense at the boundary between logic and experience, namely, the principles of science. Like logic, the principles of science are a-priori (see proposition 6.34 of the Tractatus, Wittgenstein 1933); but they are also part of science, which describes the world as it is and is made of factual propositions. Interestingly, Tejedor links their a-priori status with their being essentially know-how: we know a-priori the principles of science in that we are able to construct scientific propositions, using them as bricks, to borrow Wittgenstein's metaphor (Tractatus, 6.431). This active aspect, embodied in our ability to do things, immediately calls to mind On Certainty's so-called hinge propositions, and it is no coincidence that in the latter work Wittgenstein observes: 'Am I not getting closer and closer to saying that in the end logic cannot be described? You must look at the practice of language, then you will see it' (Wittgenstein 1974, § 501).

In On Certainty, Wittgenstein also points out the lack of sharpness in the distinction between logical and empirical propositions (§§ 97, 319). This seems to confirm Klagge's view, according to which, as we saw, the later Wittgenstein admits that, at least sometimes, empirical knowledge can determine changes in our concepts. Does this mean that science and philosophy, in the end, are on the same plane? I think it does not. If on the one hand Wittgenstein (1974, § 98) acknowledges that 'the same proposition may get treated at one time as something to test by experience, at another as a rule for testing', on the other hand he insisted that 'if someone were to say "So logic too is an empirical science" he would be wrong' (Ibid.). The distinction between grammar and experience is not sharp, but it is there, and even granted that scientific discoveries may, in the long run, influence our concepts, this by no means entails that the work of science and the work of philosophy come into contact here. The very boundary between the empirical and the conceptual can be investigated both by science and philosophy, but the two remain distinct in their methodologies and objectives. Philosophy can interrogate itself on how our concepts would be, were some 'very general facts of nature' different (Wittgenstein 2009, PPF, § 366), but the point of this investigation is not empirical or causal; it is still grammatical, and its aim is to direct our attention to the complex and contingent interrelation between the way we use words and the way we live (see Hertzberg 2011 and Perissinotto 2016).

If this is right, then Wittgenstein's point, when he leaves the question open as to whether our form of life would be different if, for instance, a mechanical 'lie detector' were provided for us (Wittgenstein 1992, p. 95), is best understood not as a suggestion that the question would be answered by 'those in the future' (as Klagge puts it, p. 202), but rather as a grammatical reminder as to how our concepts and our ways of living are inextricably entangled. In the case under discussion (the 'lie detector'), the point is also to highlight that the radical uncertainty characterizing our judgments on others' feelings and thoughts is an important part of our form of life, and picturing this constitutional uncertainty as a lack of empirical knowledge is a fundamental scientistic fallacy (see Child's contribution, esp. pp. 91-98).

As this brief discussion shows, taking Wittgenstein's anti-scientism seriously provides a powerful interpretative theme for understanding his whole conception of philosophy, since the latter was shaped broadly in opposition to scientism. The fruitfulness of such a reflection is confirmed by this book. Although not all the essays, in my judgment, have the same level of insight, and in spite of some repetition especially in the introductory pages of various chapters, it is an important contribution that opens up several new vistas onto a familiar, though central, area of Wittgenstein's philosophy.


Bengtsson, G., Säätelä, S. and Pichler, A. eds. 2018 New Essays on Frege. Between Science and Literature, Springer

Cahill, Kevin M. (2011) The Fate of Wonder: Wittgenstein's Critique of Metaphysics and Modernity, Columbia University Press

McDowell, J. (2002) 'Wittgenstein on Following a Rule', in A. Miller and C. Wright, eds. Rule-Following and Meaning, Acumen

Hertzberg, Lars (2011) 'Very General Facts of Nature', in Kuusela, O. and McGinn, M. eds. The Oxfod Handbook of Wittgenstein, Oxford University Press

Perissinotto, Luigi (2016) 'Concept-Formations and Facts of Nature in Wittgenstein', Paradigmi -- Rivista di critica filosofica, 34 (3): 11-31

Wittgenstein, Ludwig (1933) Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig (1974) On Certainty, ed. by G.E.M. Anscombe, G.H. von Wright, Blackwell

Wittgenstein, Ludwig (1980) Culture and Value, ed. G.H. von Wright, Blackwell

Wittgenstein, Ludwig (1992) Last Writings of the Philosophy of Psychology, Vol. 2: The Inner and the Outer, ed. by G.H. von Wright and H. Nyman, Blackwell

Wittgenstein, Ludwig (1993) 'Remarks on Frazer's Golden Bough'. In Philosophical Occasions 1912-1951, ed. by J. Klagge and A. Nordmann, Hackett

Wittgenstein. Ludwig (2009) Philosophical Investigations, ed. P.M.S. Hacker and J. Schulte, Wiley-Blackwell