Wittgenstein and the Moral Life: Essays in Honor of Cora Diamond

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Alice Crary (ed.), Wittgenstein and the Moral Life: Essays in Honor of Cora Diamond, MIT Press, 2007, 409pp., $36.00 (pbk), ISBN 0262532867.

Reviewed by Dale Jacquette, University of Bern


The previously unpublished papers collected in this volume reflect two of Cora Diamond's major philosophical ambitions.  Lest anyone suppose the book is about Wittgenstein on the moral life, despite some intersection of themes, the book is eponymously divided into two main parts, the first substantially longer than the second, respectively, on 'Wittgenstein' and 'The Moral Life'.  Diamond is known for challenging readers especially of Wittgenstein's Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus not to 'chicken out' when it comes to interpreting the force of the penultimate passage of the text, 6.54, where Wittgenstein maintains 'My propositions are … senseless [unsinnig]'.  Diamond has spearheaded unflinching efforts to interpret Wittgenstein's treatise holistically, with particular emphasis on this troublesome sentence.  Diamond is also admired for her sustained ethical stance concerning the (mis-) treatment of animals -- the inhuman use, to morph Norbert Weiner's phrase, of nonhuman beings.

The book opens with an insightful and beautifully succinct Introduction by Crary, followed by these eleven contributions:  Part I Wittgenstein -- James Conant, 'Mild Mono-Wittgensteinianism'; Michael Kremer, 'The Cardinal Problem of Philosophy'; Juliet Floyd, 'Wittgenstein and the Inexpressible'; Hilary Putnam, 'Wittgenstein and the Real Numbers'; David H. Finkelstein, 'Holism and Animal Minds'.  Part II The Moral Life -- Stanley Cavell, 'Companionable Thinking'; John McDowell, 'Comments on Stanley Cavell's "Companionable Thinking"'; Sabina Lovibond, '"In Spite of the Misery of the World": Ethics, Contemplation, and the Source of Value'; Martha Nussbaum, 'A Novel in Which Nothing Happens: Fontane's Der Stechlin and Literary Friendship'; Stephen Mulhall, 'The Mortality of the Soul: Bernard Williams's Character(s)'; Alice Crary, 'Humans, Animals, Right and Wrong'.  Notes to the individual essays are immediately attached to each as they appear, and the volume concludes with a combined name and subject index.

All of the essays are valuable in their own right as worthwhile philosophical discussions of their particular topics.  I nevertheless found myself disappointed by the fact that the essays taught me relatively little in-depth about Diamond's philosophy.  There are many ways of honoring a highly-regarded thinker, and certainly bringing together essays by persons who have been influenced by the individual's work is one tried and true method.  From my perspective, however, previously knowing something but not very much about Diamond's thought, I had hoped that the present volume would provide a window on her ideas, as the title seemed to promise, an introduction to be pursued thereafter, turning more assiduously to original writings after being prepared to understand Diamond's philosophy in perspective.  I expected a roadmap to point out places of interest in Diamond's work, with solid sharply-focused critical interaction to make the philosopher's opus come alive, calling attention to attractions and hazards en route, to wonders and difficulties that might otherwise go unnoticed or under-appreciated.  Crary's Introduction goes some distance toward this goal, but the essays by and large do not.  The authors in virtually every instance pay lip service at some point to Diamond as someone whose seminal writings on this or that exegetical or philosophical problem have had an impact on their own thinking, or with whom they have discussed related ideas in the past, and then proceed to ride their own hobbyhorses to the end of the essay on whatever subject other than Diamond (Bernard Williams, Donald Davidson, Fontane, etc.) they prefer to discuss.

Here, as befits a review of such a diverse collection of philosophical essays, are some (highly impressionistic) impressions that cannot pretend to do justice to any of the individual essays.  The usual reasons of space forbid my discussing all of the papers individually, by which I mean no disapproval by neglect.  I concentrate instead on those that I think bear the most criticism, rather than squandering my word allotment in paltry synopsis.  Thus, I pass over with little or no comment some of my favorite papers in the collection, especially those of Floyd, Lovibond, and Mulhall.

Part I Wittgenstein.  Conant, taking inspiration years ago from Diamond's groundbreaking essay, 'Throwing Away the Ladder', has led the charge of 'resolute' interpreters of Wittgenstein's early philosophy in the Tractatus.  The term 'resolute' in this application in turn derives from Thomas Rickett's essay, 'Pictures, Logic, and the Limits of Sense in Wittgenstein's Tractatus', in the (1996) Cambridge Companion to Wittgenstein, edited by Hans Sluga and David G. Stern.  Conant's essay, which we can take with due disclaimers as representative of this section, weighs in at 112 pages including extensive notes.  The paper, in somewhat grandstanding fashion, occupies a disproportionate 28% of the book's entire mass.  Conant frames religious analogies of the Tractatus (Old Testament) and Philosophical Investigations and other posthumata (New Testament) with fabricated quotations from a fictional Johannes Climacus, pirating Kierkegaard's pseudonym, in order to talk about the positions developed in his own essay from an ironic, third-person perspective.

Within this quasi-literary format, Conant repackages 'New Wittgensteinian' ideas about the Tractatus with which he is affiliated.  Interesting new twists are nevertheless woven into the mix as Conant considers a succession of lists of theses that might be attributed to Wittgenstein in the Tractatus, together with what Conant extrapolates as Wittgenstein's imagined later reactions to them.  The issue, or one of them anyway, in trying to understand the relation between the two main periods of Wittgenstein's lifework, is that if the later Wittgenstein rejects what the early Wittgenstein wrote, especially about meaning and the constellation of associated topics, as he certainly seems to do in Philosophical Investigations, Philosophical Grammar and Philosophical Remarks (from The Big Typescript), then it would appear that either the early Wittgenstein was trying after all to advance meaningful theses capable of being denied anon, or else at least that the later Wittgenstein takes himself to have previously done so.  Since both possibilities argue against resolute readings of the Tractatus as Wittgenstein's effort to do away with all attempts at philosophical discourse as irredeemably meaningless, as certain critics of the New Wittgensteinians have argued, the topic has special urgency for their approach.

Pros and cons of resolute or non-chickening-out readings of the Tractatus notwithstanding, I am troubled by the fact that in 6.54 Wittgenstein does not merely say that his propositions up to 6.54 are literally nonsensical, but that his propositions (period, full stop) are such.  To my way of thinking, this does not merely suggest but fully implies that it is literally nonsensical for Wittgenstein also to have written that his propositions are literally nonsensical.  It is hard for me accordingly to understand how anyone could intelligibly adopt a resolute reading of 6.54.  For the passage also pulls the rug out from under itself as equally unsinnig as the rest of the text.  A resolute, non-chickening-out reading of 6.54 would have us be firm in treating the Tractatus as totally and thoroughly inexpressible, even non-showable, nonsense, on the basis of a Scheinsatz, a pseudo-proposition that Wittgenstein himself declares is nonsensical.  Must not a resolutist, then, trying to be resolute in particular about the implications of passage 6.54, choose which propositions in the text not to chicken out about, while chickening out on the literal meaninglessness of the one key sentence that is supposed to justify their resoluteness?  These are mysteries that the resolutists, at least in the present venue, do not venture to resolve.

Still, the New Wittgensteinians, following Diamond, and with Conant among others manifestly at the helm, have done an invaluable service in calling attention to previously unremarked difficulties in understanding the real message of Wittgenstein's Tractatus, and of the too frequently underestimated pitfalls of reading the text without keeping 6.54 along with all the other putative nonsense of the text doggedly if not quite resolutely in mind.  Ultimately, though, I find Conant's distinctions and range of alternative approaches to the text far too limiting, despite his efforts to work out a variety of resolutist heterodoxies, including mild, severe, and zealous mono-Wittgensteinianisms (like different versions of monotheism, following the religious conceit Conant playfully develops throughout the essay).  The distinction between resolute and irresolute readings of the Tractatus strikes me as especially cartoonish, a set of false alternatives.  Wittgenstein's early treatise presents itself as something more like a work of medieval mysticism, describing a course of thought or way of life that the sage or saint has had to work through over time and finally surpassed or triumphed against, arriving at ineffable insights amounting to a revelation.  The ladder metaphor in 6.54, adapted from Arthur Schopenhauer's The World as Will and Representation, resonates also with iconic imagery of the Middle Ages as an evocation of Wittgenstein's lifelong spiritual preoccupations.  Bertrand Russell asked a pacing young Wittgenstein in his room whether he was thinking about logic or his sins, to which Wittgenstein characteristically answered, 'Both' (Russell, Autobiography, Chapter 9).  If Conant's fundamental distinction among interpretations is correct, however, then categorizing Wittgenstein's early philosophy as ineffable belongs exclusively to the irresolute, chickening-out approach to reading the thornier passages of the Tractatus.

I am amazed, finally, to discover that resolutists who want to be faithful to Wittgenstein's conclusions in Tractatus 6.54 and, especially, 7, seem to have spilled more ink in commentary, polemics, and in-fighting than all of what they consider to be the naïve irresolute writing on Wittgenstein's early philosophy put together and squared.  It appears that in order to be resolute, to avoid chickening out in the effort to be consistently loyal to Wittgenstein's insight that 'Whereof one cannot speak, thereof one must be silent', a philosophical commentator must be inexhaustibly prolix.  To understand Wittgenstein, one cannot practice what one preaches; the resolute interpreter of Wittgenstein cannot be a consistent committed Wittgensteinian by his or her own lights, but must enter the fray as an outsider, a non- or even anti-Wittgensteinian.  If we are convinced that Wittgenstein advocates silence instead of meaningless prattle about philosophical problems, should we not be silent about the need to be silent?  Is that not what Wittgenstein did when he abandoned philosophy for primary school teaching in the Alps?  Should we not in all consistency then at least acknowledge that loyal Wittgensteinians trying to think and talk resolutely about Wittgenstein's counseling philosophers to be silent are equally engaging in pseudo-propositional nonsense?

For a parting topic of criticism in the first part of Crary's edition, I turn to Putnam's paper, in which he argues that the reason why Wittgenstein offers puzzling pronouncements about Cantor's diagonalization argument for the existence of transfinite cardinalities (which Wittgenstein in Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics disparages as a 'prahlerischen Beweis'), and the ontic status of real numbers, is that Wittgenstein simply did not know enough about mathematics and its applications in physics to understand the indispensability of real numbers in the sciences.  I hope I am not alone in finding Putnam's abductive explanation of Wittgenstein's antagonism to transfinitary mathematics not only uncharitable and inadequately motivated, but historically implausible, given Wittgenstein's education and demonstrated practical familiarity with cutting-edge developments in logic, mathematics, and engineering.  Putnam, furthermore, overlooks Wittgenstein's reliance on real-numbered continua as entering into the logical analysis of propositions in his solution to the color incompatibility problem in the subsequently disowned 1929 essay, 'Some Remarks on Logical Form'.  Could it be instead that Wittgenstein takes a radical conceptually austere approach to the foundations of mathematics and consequently to all its conventional superstructure?  There is precedent aplenty for such an attitude in the strict finitist philosophies of mathematics of George Berkeley, David Hume, and L.E.J. Brouwer, among others, all of whom are prepared to topple higher mathematics and its applications as philosophically ill-founded if their conceptual reservations cannot be satisfactorily resolved.

Finkelstein's essay, the last in this first main part, though primarily a criticism of Donald Davidson's thesis that propositional linguistic competence is a requirement for the possibility of having beliefs that appears unavailable outside our own species, bridges especially the later Wittgenstein's remarks about the intentionality of thought and requirements of philosophical grammar of discourse about belief, doubt, and other psychological states, with Diamond's moral concerns about conduct toward nonhuman animals.

Part II The Moral Life.  Originally written for another occasion, as the final endnote (n. 1, 351) reveals, a conference on literature and ethics at the University of Helsinki, Nussbaum's essay typifies the inclusion of essays in the volume that have virtually nothing to say about Diamond.  Nussbaum writes, after a five page foray into a blow-by-blow narration of a novel she curiously enough characterizes as a work in which nothing happens, at the conclusion of her section I: 

Thinking about Der Stechlin seems to me a good way to honor Cora Diamond.  So often, like Fontane, she asked us all to question assumptions about structure, "plot," and sequence that hobble philosophy as surely as they hobble the novel, asking ourselves what revolutions in style and structure, as well as content, a due attention to life's complexities might require of us.  Perhaps, too, Fontane's praise of conversation is an appropriate way of indicating how deeply I value our years of conversation about these and other topics. (331)

A tenuous connection, to say the least.  Thereafter, Diamond's name does not appear even once again in the essay.  If a classical analogy for this sort of paste-in tribute is appropriate, I am reminded of nothing so much as the statues of a later decadent antiquity, frugally made in two parts -- a full-length body in flowing tunic with an open socket at the neck to be completed by cementing-in any choice of interchangeable sculpted heads.  One easily imagines hauling out the same philosophical paper and tacking on a different homage for an entirely different Festschrift, acknowledging the work of any almost any other philosopher, or, potentially, in this case, comparative literary critic.

We see this even in the collection's concluding essay by Crary, whose Introduction to the volume provides a much-appreciated overview of Diamond's philosophy in thirteen pages before proceeding to gloss the edited essays.  Crary in her own contribution to Part II writes:  'In describing this view, I am influenced by the work of Cora Diamond -- in even more ways than are explicitly acknowledged in the pages that follow' (382).  Explicit references to Diamond in the body of the essay are indeed conspicuous by their absence, although Crary, much to her credit, does at least bring in an interesting argument of Diamond's concerning the treatment of living animals versus dead human bodies, in connection with the view that there may be something intrinsically morally valuable about the fact of being human.  Even Crary, however, outside of her Introduction, does not focus or concentrate in detail on any of Diamond's work, examining the arguments and outlook thoroughly, to help shed light on Diamond's views about the ethics of our conduct toward nonhuman animals.

What I would have liked to have seen in the book is at least a handful of essays that discuss and criticize Diamond's philosophy at length, perhaps a single one of her significant papers, tracing connections to the development of her thought over the years and separating the gold from the dross.  Cavell in my opinion does about the best job of integrating discussion of Diamond's own work with interests of his own, while staying on track for much of his paper on Diamond.  McDowell's contribution is exceptional also in that he responds to Cavell's preceding essay with almost exclusive concern for its connection to Diamond's work.  I may have learned more about Diamond's philosophical outlook from Crary's Introduction and McDowell's response to Cavell than from all the other papers combined.  McDowell's paper remains an oddity nonetheless.  Crary's editorial apparatus does not explain how McDowell came to read Cavell's paper, or how it is that his paper answers Cavell as another contributor to the book, nor does McDowell offer a clue to this anomaly that none of the other essays in the book features.

I was puzzled when I first paged through the essays and examined the table of contents, to observe that, contrary to custom, there was no reply to contributing authors or concluding expository essay by Diamond herself.  This strikes me still as something missing, something that would have rounded off the discussions and have offered Diamond a platform from which to look back on what she thinks she has accomplished and who, if any, of her well-wishers have properly understood what she has been about.  After reading the papers, it was clear in any case that there was scant discussion devoted specifically to Diamond's work to which she could have responded.  My personal sense of a missed opportunity to learn something more concrete about Diamond's thought aside, the innocent reader should be advised that the otherwise independently interesting essays in this volume will absolutely not satisfy their desire to be much enlightened about Diamond's philosophy.  For that, we shall have to read or re-read Diamond's books and essays, and undertake to formulate on our own what might have been provided here as a starting place toward working out a retrospective critical appraisal of Diamond's interpretation of Wittgenstein and philosophy of the moral life.