Wittgenstein and the Philosophy of Mind

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Jonathan Ellis and Daniel Guevara (eds.), Wittgenstein and the Philosophy of Mind, Oxford University Press, 2012, 352pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199737666.

Reviewed by Olav Gjelsvik, University of Oslo


This new collection (containing eleven original essays, an introduction, and a foreword) aims to make a case for the value of Wittgenstein's writings for contemporary philosophy of mind. This important aim is, in my judgment, achieved to a very significant extent. The collection is a good one, and makes a most welcome addition to the literature. With that said, it should also be pointed out that the task the editors set is challenging, not least because so much has happened in philosophy of mind that Wittgenstein never considered, developments for which his approach to philosophical problems has relevance without this relevance being obvious. Furthermore, philosophy today proceeds more and more into relatively isolated sub-disciplines where contributors discuss each other's work without always seeing all relevant ways of asking more general questions. To some extent this is a product of the sheer size of the philosophical community; few people have a good overview of what is happening. The volume is a push towards better integration of philosophical insights: a contrary force to the centrifugal forces in operation. The strength of these centrifugal forces makes the collection's task difficult.

One can group the essays in many different ways. Here is the way I find most natural. There are five essays that are largely interpretations of Wittgenstein's texts that try to show their significance for systematic questions.  These are the essays by Barry Stroud, Warren Goldfarb, Robert J. Fogelin, Juliet Floyd, and P.M.S. Hacker. The other six essays are primarily problem oriented and vary a lot in the degree to which they are closely attuned to Wittgenstein and his texts. These include the essays by Brian O'Shaughnessy, John Campbell, Jim Hopkins, Christopher Peacocke, Jonathan Ellis, and Claude Imbert. The approaches of these six vary more than those of the first five. Some, like Jonathan Ellis, try to demonstrate the importance of Wittgensteinian insights for some specific problem. Others develop some systematic view that might illuminate Wittgenstein's own (for instance O'Shaughnessy). Still others develop views that might even be in some tension with Wittgenstein's, as is the case with Christopher Peacocke and John Campbell.

It is impossible in this short review to engage properly with each essay, saying something of real value about the topic it discusses and the contribution it makes. I shall only try to say something that I hope is of value to those who simply are curious about what goes on in this collection.

Stroud's 'Meaning and Understanding' starts with the Tractatus, and, in a very short space, achieves an overview of Wittgenstein's development in some crucial dimensions. Stroud also has a deep and engaging discussion of what goes on in the central paragraphs around 200 in Philosophical Investigations (PI). He considers their import for the prospects of a full-blooded (as opposed to a modest) account of meaning. Stroud brings out very clearly how those paragraphs (contrary to the way they have been taken by Michael Dummett and by Crispin Wright) aim to establish very definite limitations on what we can do in terms of giving an account of what someone means by his or her words. Stroud's efforts are convincing and set a high standard. He also explains how Wittgenstein's position can, in a certain way, be seen as close to Kant's. A similar resistance to Dummett's and Wright's readings of Wittgenstein is explicit in several other essays in the collection.

Goldfarb's 'Rule-Following Revisited' is a penetrating discussion (based on a close-reading) of what is going on in some of the same central paragraphs of PI. He places special emphasis on the sort of conception(s) or picture(s) of how rules determine their applications that Wittgenstein resists as deeply misleading. Goldfarb traces the way that Wittgenstein tries to free us from such pictures. There are two basic ways of taking this determination of future occasions of use, the epistemological and the metaphysical, and Goldfarb discusses both in illuminating ways. If we reject the constitutive metaphysical reading, there is a danger of falling into some version of (radical) conventionalism. On the other hand, operating with certain traditional kinds of epistemological pictures makes it hard to see the delicate reminders of our actual epistemic practices that Wittgenstein also supplies. This is a very rich essay. It throws a lot of light on the exact moves in the texts, particularly regarding the way  the thesis that following a rule is a practice is established, and what the import of that thesis is. Goldfarb connects his reading of the central paragraphs with readings of many of the surrounding ones, for instance the paragraphs about 'justification coming to an end', and 'following the rule blindly'.

Fogelin's interesting 'The Private Language Argument One More Time' also deals with the private language argument, and engages partly with his own earlier influential interpretations, starting with his 1976 book. The basic change is to emphasize Wittgenstein's claim that he is not trying to present an argument in support of a philosophical thesis. When Wittgenstein puts forward something that sounds like a philosophical thesis, it must be taken as a reminder of the grammar of the expressions in question. This raises a number of issues about philosophical grammar and its significance, and Fogelin pursues these  to provide a general perspective, not least on the paragraphs from about 240 and the later ones dealing with sensation language.

Hacker's 'Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Psychology: Methodological Reflections' provides something one might think of as a bird's eye view of Wittgenstein's approach to psychological concepts. Nobody alive has contributed more than Hacker to Wittgenstein scholarship. Here he describes Wittgenstein's turn to psychological issues in the mid-nineteen-forties (when PI was more or less completed) and gives a numbered overview of the deeper commitments Wittgenstein had at that time. These include: to never put forward theories, theses, anything hypothetical, etc., and to rest only with grammatical explanations where nothing is hidden from view and which leave things as they are by only removing conceptual confusions. I consider this an extremely helpful picture to start out from, but also one that fruitfully leaves us with further questions as we progress more and more into these investigations and into the philosophy of psychology. Hacker's essay is clear and stimulating.

Floyd's 'Das Überraschende: Wittgenstein on the Surprising in Mathematics' differs somewhat from the other essays. Floyd's aim is to describe, understand and see the significance of Wittgenstein's interest in psychological and emotional responses within mathematics, among mathematicians. These responses amount to a certain sort of "raw material" about the activity of mathematics, and they are typically not attended to by philosophically minded commentators. They are not really dealt with even in Floyd's own numerous and significant earlier contributions to our understanding of Wittgenstein's approach to issues in the philosophy of mathematics. The material she presents is fascinating in many ways. It provides an informed description of a conception of the setting in which real mathematical work lives and breathes, and of the richer surrounding practices in which the doing and accepting of calculations and proofs must be understood, in some broad sense of being understood. There are many interesting connections to the more general work about the notions of seeing as and seeing aspects in PI, and there is a wealth of material. To me this essay is the most "Überraschende" in the whole collection.

Moving on to the other essays, there are close connections among O'Shaughnessy, Campbell, and Peacocke, and, to a lesser extent, among Hopkins, Ellis and Peacocke. The essay by Claude Imbert stands pretty much on its own.

Campbell's 'Wittgenstein and the Role of Experience in Understanding Language' launches a Russellian challenge to Wittgenstein. He argues that Russellian knowledge by acquaintance, acquaintance with slabs or colours, provides a basis for the subject's knowledge of truths. Russell of course saw knowledge by acquaintance as logically simpler than knowledge of truths, and as something we can appeal to in providing an explanation of knowledge of truths and of being right or wrong. To make it available more generally for this purpose, we need to construe acquaintance much more liberally than Russell actually did, but that can be done. Campbell delivers his challenge directly and subtly, and by doing that invites exchanges with defenders of Wittgenstein. The essay ought to generate many interesting discussions, not least about how this topic of kinds of knowledge relates to the discussion about practices and rule following.

Peacocke's essay is challenging and intricate, and takes us through a lot of deep and engaging considerations. It is to a large extent a chapter from his book, Truly Understood (Oxford, 2008), and as such it is best appreciated by its role in that work (previously reviewed in NDPR).   Peacocke launches a general view that gives a substantive role to reference within a general theory of understanding and concept-possession, and extends and applies that view to our concepts of conscious states like pain. Here understanding involves tacit knowledge of an identity of properties, or an identity at the level of reference. This view is very subtly developed and defended, and is, I think, possibly in some conflict with Wittgenstein's view that the philosopher's typical mistake is to overgeneralize from some feature found in some part of language to all of language. Peacocke claims a number of advantages for his view, and these claims seem to me to be in the main correct. Whether the general view is acceptable is a different matter.

O'Shaughnessy's main concern is how the discussions of seeing-as and Wittgenstein's interest in this in fact exhibit a commitment of sorts to seeing the understanding as fundamentally involved in all kinds of seeing. The thesis that all seeing in a certain sense involves 'seeing as' seems possibly to be a stronger thesis than anything Wittgenstein puts forward in his writings, and of course Wittgenstein did not officially put forward any thesis but just reminded us of what we knew already. The essay is a strong and well-written piece from a very original thinker, and it is indeed quite fascinating to see how close O'Shaughnessy's thoughts on the philosophy of perception are to Wittgenstein's, even if the one puts forward theses when the other does not. The essay leaves us with a real task of thinking through the significance of this fact. If O'Shaughnessy is close to right, it might also provide the beginnings of an answer to Campbell's challenge.

Ellis and Hopkins both discuss Wittgenstein's significance for problems regarding physicalism. Ellis is concerned to show that many debates about 'what it is like'-ness in the philosophy of mind start from assumptions that Wittgenstein gives us reason to doubt, assumptions about what phenomenal character is. Very briefly put, the assumption is that phenomenal character is something that can be identical to something like a physical property. It could instead be that phenomenal character is not something that even could be identical to anything like physical properties, without this constituting any threat to physicalism, any more than in a number of somewhat parallel cases such as that of price. This would explain why we find it so hard to accept the identity-statement; this would not be because physicalism is false, but because asking the question about the truth or falsehood of an identity statement is some sort of category mistake. I found Ellis's essay valuable, stimulating and provocative. It provides an interesting challenge that says that much philosophical work is simply misguided, something definitely in the spirit of Wittgenstein. Ellis could be dead right -- more work is, however, needed to show that.

Hopkins is almost doing the opposite of Ellis. His claim, made in the case of pain, is rather that we, from a Wittgensteinian point of view, can come to see that we, subjects who experience pain in all its awfulness, are not, in our conception of pain, taking in the full nature of the object. It is so easy to suppose that we do, and easy to go wrong at this point. We do not represent pain as having extension, or as taking place in some definite objective structure in the body. In doing that we in fact mistake a partial conception of pain for a full conception of pain, and that leads to all sorts of problems in thinking about the relationship between the pain and the body. If this is right, Ellis must be deeply wrong, or so it seems to me. There is in that case no category mistake but a very different sort of mistake that shows up in our concept of pain. Hopkins's essay is elegant and challenging, and very learned about Wittgenstein's text. Comparing and discussing these two essays further is a very inviting task -- to be left for some other occasion.

Imbert's essay is quite different again. It deals with a number of themes from Wittgenstein's writings on pain, and brings in connections to St. Augustine, the Stoics, and makes a number of other observations about aspects of the cultural history surrounding Wittgenstein's work. To me it is an absolutely fascinating piece, but not easy to assess philosophically, as it is mainly suggestive rather than interpretative or argumentative. But it offers a lot to think about.

All of these papers, and some others as well, were presented during a seven-day conference in Santa Cruz in California some years back. The introductory essay by the editors and the foreword by David Hills show (rather than say) what a good seven days this must have been. The editors' introduction presents the conference and the themes admirably. Hills' foreword, which originated as a comment on Hacker, provides a very thoughtful and inspiring preparation for the excellent essays that follow. It also provides much more, particularly by way of  perspectives on the whole background for the discussions of these seven days.

Summing up, this collection brings together first-rate interpretative essays that exhibit the import of Wittgenstein's philosophy for general philosophical issues and especially for fundamental questions in the philosophy of mind, and equally good essays in the philosophy of mind, written with full awareness of many of the most important insights in Wittgenstein. Philosophers of mind and Wittgenstein scholars will benefit much from a close reading of these essays.  Moreover, the book should be of great interest to all philosophers. It is a major contribution that will be of lasting value.