Wittgenstein and Theology

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Tim Labron, Wittgenstein and Theology, Continuum, 2009, 153pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780567601056.

Reviewed by Duncan Richter, Virginia Military Institute



This is a short book (131 pages, eight of them blank, plus notes, bibliography, and an imperfect index), consisting of eight chapters, the first four on Wittgenstein and the last four on theology and Wittgenstein’s relation to it. Labron wants to argue that there are two important analogies between Wittgenstein’s philosophy and theology. The first of these is that Wittgenstein’s work shows a transition similar to one found in the Bible. Wittgenstein’s transition takes him from his early view that logic underlies language, and thus is (in a sense) hidden by it, to his later view that logic is revealed by language. Similarly, according to Labron, in the Bible there is a transition from the (in a sense) hidden God of the Old Testament to the revealed God of the New Testament. His second main analogy is between Wittgenstein’s understanding of the relation between logic and language, on the one hand, and the Council of Chalcedon’s understanding of the relation between the divine and the human aspects of Christ, on the other. Labron acknowledges that analogies have their limits but offers his in the hope that they will prove interesting. How interesting they are is likely to depend on one’s religious and theological preferences. Atheists, Calvinists, and Catholics are likely to find more food for scorn than for thought, but Lutherans might well find Labron’s argument suggestive.

Labron does not try to prove that Wittgenstein was or was not religious. On the contrary, he insists that Wittgenstein had no theological or religious agenda, which might make one wonder why anyone would want to apply his work to theology. What Labron does try to do comes out in passages such as this: “Wittgenstein’s shift from epistemology to logic, from an underlying logical form to logic shown in the application of language, is analogical to the communication of attributes and incarnation. Christ mediates God and language mediates logic … I admit that it is a stretch, but it is interesting” (pp. 78-79).

This reference to Wittgenstein’s having shifted from epistemology to logic will suggest to some readers that Labron’s grasp of Wittgenstein’s philosophy is shaky. After all, Wittgenstein’s early work was very much concerned with logic, but barely at all with epistemology, while his last notes were, in contrast, all about questions of knowledge, certainty, and doubt. It is hard to say much for or against Labron on this score, however, as he really says too little about Wittgenstein to reveal the extent of his understanding. He devotes less than forty pages to an overview of Wittgenstein’s philosophical work, and much of this is about Descartes, Locke, and Berkeley, with whose work Labron contrasts Wittgenstein’s. Much of the rest consists of quotations rather than explanations. Not everyone will agree with Labron’s take on what Wittgenstein is up to, especially in his early work, but there is nothing exceptionally bad about his exposition.

The speed at which this exposition goes, however, means that some difficult ideas are rather hurried over. For instance, the notion of logical form is hardly made transparent by this: “It is important to see that logical form is not an addition to propositions and reality, as if it is a third category that acts as a kind of glue to hold everything together; rather, it is simply shown in this relationship” (p. 38). Explaining how we know about logical form is no substitute for telling us what it is. Labron does go on to say a little more about it (that logical form enables propositions to be true or false, that it permeates everything that is sayable, that it says nothing, and that it is “an external stricture to which language must adhere”) but some readers will surely still feel mystified.

To this kind of obscurity, which is perhaps inevitable in a brief account of Wittgenstein’s difficult work, is added a sense of paradox or self-contradiction. On p. 39 we are told that the simple objects in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus are metaphysical foundations, while on p. 42 it is claimed that Wittgenstein’s early work (of which the prime instance is the Tractatus) “rejects metaphysics.” On p. 45 Labron quotes Wittgenstein’s very late On Certainty saying that in cases where the expression “I do not know” makes no sense, the expression “I know” makes no sense either. A few lines down this is explained as Wittgenstein’s responding to the skeptic not with a theory but by showing "how we do know reality." If Wittgenstein thinks that talk of knowledge here is meaningless then Labron’s gloss surely cannot be an accurate account of what Wittgenstein takes himself to be doing. Of course, Wittgenstein might be wrong, but then there is even less reason to care about what his work might imply for theology (or for anything else).

Labron also makes some implausible philosophical claims of his own. On p. 46 he writes that “Language and reality are by nature social and interactive,” which is hard to comprehend. Reality is social? This certainly sounds like the idealism that Labron and Wittgenstein want no part of. Similarly on p. 53 Labron writes,

In contrast to Descartes’ and Locke’s dichotomy between language and reality, and ideas and reality, and in contrast to Berkeley’s melding of these categories, the Investigations show that language and life are a whole and neither language nor life has priority over the other.

It is far from clear how Berkeley’s (alleged) melding of the categories of language and reality is supposed to contrast with Wittgenstein’s (alleged) showing that language and life are a whole. Is reality to be contrasted with life? Does Berkeley artificially meld while Wittgenstein simply shows what is already a whole? Labron does not clarify.

At times Labron’s logic is curious. He discusses Kai Nielsen’s charge that some Wittgensteinians, though not Wittgenstein himself, are guilty of what Nielsen calls ‘Wittgensteinian fideism.’ Labron’s defense of these Wittgensteinians, though, is based on this assertion: "The problem here is that Wittgenstein’s philosophy does not offer the support to fideism that Nielson [sic] thinks it does. Therefore, not only are the Wittgensteinians innocent of the charge, Wittgenstein never supplied the motive in the first place" (p. 63). So a criticism of Wittgensteinians, and explicitly not of Wittgenstein himself, is supposedly defeated by irrelevantly asserting (with some additional argument) that Wittgenstein was not guilty of the charge! To his credit, though, Labron rightly points out that allegedly fideistic Wittgensteinians disagree with Nielsen about the nature of the relation between religion and other aspects of human life, not about whether there is any such relation.

The second part of the book also suffers from apparent inconsistency. The book’s opening paragraph tells us that “theology is not yet one of the prominent disciplines that Wittgenstein has influenced” (p. 3). Yet the book goes on to quote Fergus Kerr’s 1986 book Theology after Wittgenstein and to discuss varying interpretations of Wittgenstein by theologians such as Kevin Vanhoozer and George Lindbeck. What Labron seems to have in mind is that these theologians have used Wittgenstein’s ideas to promote their own theories, but have not produced a thoroughly Wittgensteinian theology. This is perhaps a slightly unfair criticism, though, given that Wittgenstein said that one could agree with him philosophically and still hold any religious beliefs one liked. Since doing philosophy in Wittgenstein’s way involves, he says, saying only what everyone will agree to, there surely can be no place in it for controversial religious or theological ideas. Theology is naturally controversial, so it does not lend itself to thoroughgoing Wittgensteinianism.

Labron presents Wittgenstein’s philosophy as a sort of middle way, avoiding the pitfalls of Lockean realism and Berkeleyan idealism, while Labron’s favored type of theology analogously avoids the dangers of (arguably) taking religion too literally (e.g., the Catholic understanding of the Eucharist, fundamentalist ideas about creation, and so on) and of taking it too symbolically. But religion is not metaphysics. According to Wittgenstein, metaphysics is inherently confused, arising from a mistaken treatment of conceptual questions or truths as if they were empirical or synthetic. He does not think of religion as essentially confused in this way. If Wittgenstein, following Luther, is right that theology is the grammar of the word ‘God’, and if this word is used differently by different groups of people, then there will be different grammars and different theologies. These might not all be equally good, but Wittgensteinian philosophy aims only at describing grammar, not judging it. Any language that can be used, any theology that can be lived, will surely not fail any Wittgensteinian test of meaningfulness.

Perhaps the most interesting thing about Wittgenstein and Theology is that it almost deconstructs itself. If we should not separate theology and practice, as Labron argues, then how can we judge theological theories without looking at the associated practices? And how are practices to be judged? Wittgenstein did not think that philosophy could judge practices as good or bad, better or worse. People must judge for themselves. It would be hard to claim that Catholic and fundamentalist ideas are inferior to other forms of Christian belief because they cannot be lived or put into practice. People do live them, and how these people live helps to show what the ideas in question mean. Purely theoretical objections to theological theories are all very well, but there is not much distinctively Wittgensteinian about them.

In Labron’s defense he is offering only what he takes to be suggestive analogies. This makes his position both harder to attack and less worth defending. An example of Labron’s analogical reasoning should help to make the point. On pp. 125-126 he writes:

The continual desire to separate the human from the divine, and to place priority on reason, is found through the history of Christianity, but it has been rejected at various times and in various ways. The early abstract search for God beyond Jesus was answered by Gregory of Nyssa who says there is no experience beyond Jesus, the ethical path was answered by Augustine who notes that we are turned inwards and have no good in ourselves, and the path of knowledge through philosophy was answered by Luther who noted that true theology is at the cross. Wittgenstein is not a theologian and does not focus on Christianity, but his philosophy is useful in a similar manner. Recall that he says if there were a place that he could reach only by means of a ladder he would not; likewise, the above theologians throw away the ladders of moralism and rationalism.

When Wittgenstein refers to a ladder he is presumably talking about the Tractatus, which famously refers to its own propositions as rungs in a ladder that the reader is then to throw away, having climbed up and over it. The reader will then, supposedly, see the world aright. Wittgenstein later rejected this view. He is not, as Labron rightly notes, talking about theology or Christianity when he does so. So how relevant can this be to the concerns of Luther, or Augustine, or Gregory of Nyssa?

The argument of the book is hard to attack, since it consists solely of analogies, but the way the book is written can be attacked. It is both distracting and confusing. A few examples will have to suffice to make the point, but there are a great many in this short work. On p. 113 Labron writes “good-intentioned” instead of well-intentioned, on p. 75 he twice writes “mute” instead of moot, on p. 68 he writes “angles” instead of angels, on p. 41 and p. 43 Berkeley’s name is misspelled as Berkley, and several times (e.g., on pages 27 and 32) the word causal is written as “casual”. Usually this is just irritating, but it has a cumulative effect. When, on p. 71, God is contrasted with human beings partly on the ground that God is “impassable” while humans are “passable”, one does not know whether a technical theological term is being used or whether the reader is simply yet again the victim of sloppy writing or editing. According to the Oxford English Dictionary, ‘passable’ has an obscure and rare meaning of ephemeral or transient. Is this what Labron means? It is hard to know.

The book does, despite all this, have some redeeming qualities. It draws out some striking parallels between Wittgenstein’s views and Luther’s, for instance on whether it matters if the history in the Bible is inaccurate. (The main analogies described in the opening paragraph above strike me as less impressive.) These raise questions about whether one really can be a Wittgensteinian and, say, a Catholic or a Calvinist. Wittgenstein was no fan of Calvinism, while he did admire the Lutheran Kierkegaard. Is it possible that his personal beliefs infected his philosophical methodology, which was supposed to be neutral? He thought not, of course, but perhaps he was wrong. If he was wrong then his philosophy might have theological implications and these would seem most likely to be of the kind favored by Labron. If we take care to separate Wittgenstein’s personal religious beliefs from his strictly philosophical work then I suspect that such conclusions can be avoided, but there is room for debate about this. Labron aims to foster discussion and he is likely to do so. It is a shame that more time could not have been taken to include full explanations of Wittgenstein’s ideas in this book and to edit it properly.